The Birth of Sense: Generative Passivity in Merleau-Ponty's Philosophy

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Don Beith, The Birth of Sense: Generative Passivity in Merleau-Ponty's Philosophy, Ohio University Press, 2018, 202pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780821423103.

Reviewed by Glen A. Mazis, Penn State Harrisburg


Don Beith's book is an exploration of the notion of what he calls "generative passivity" as it informs Merleau-Ponty's philosophical thought. Unlike some commentators on Merleau-Ponty's works, Beith makes a strong case that Merleau-Ponty's thought is consistent throughout and does not turn from a phenomenology to an ontology in his later works. He offers a very interesting and insightful rereading of Merleau-Ponty's first book, The Structure of Behavior, showing that Merleau-Ponty had already found serious flaws with the phenomenological idea of "constitution" and was beginning to develop the articulation of how "institution" is at the heart of his notion of perception and the structure of experience in such a way as to truly render a philosophy of becoming.

The key to the book is the early chapter on reading Structure in an original way that is then applied in Merleau-Ponty's later works, especially his 1954-55 lectures on passivity (Institution and Passivity) which are examined by Beith in the second chapter. In looking at Structure in this fresh way, he manages to tackle a startling number of key philosophical ideas and call them into question in the name of Merleau-Ponty's legacy: the idea of form, the conditions for the possibility of experience, the nature of perception, the role of structure, logical possibility, the makeup of the body, the nature of things, the idea of constitution, the concept of truth, and the idea of causality within a linear sense of time. Demonstrating the shortcomings of these traditional concepts, Beith meticulously reworks Merleau-Ponty's most interesting passages in Structure to articulate a radical notion of becoming that shows that time as conceived through Merleau-Ponty's idea of institution allows him to articulate a non-foundational or emergent ontology.

The first sentence of the introductory chapter that addresses the problem of passivity in Merleau-Ponty's philosophy sets the tone for the rest of the work:

Life unfolds according to an inverse logic. Rather than emerging from preexisting causes, purposes, or conditions of possibility, life is a movement that puts itself en route by taking up and shaping the very conditions that make it possible. Conditions of possibility of sense must, paradoxically, happen in order to become possible. (1)

Beith is demonstrating that Merleau-Ponty is deconstructing a long philosophical and cultural tradition that sees life as unfolding from prior causes or according to pre-existing forms or appearing according to prior conditions of possibility, and grasping the way in which life and its environment only come to be in a back and forth of interplaying contingent events and organic responses that truly become in a continual transformation or emergence that was not in any way pregiven by the past. This is "the logic of institution."

This logic, however, can only be fully appreciated by seeing the three different types of passivity (drawing upon distinctions Anthony Steinbock uses in analyzing Husserl) at work in Merleau-Ponty's analyses: 1) "static passivity" that indicates the way in which the organism and consciousness are not activities towards the environment, but instead are relationalities with the environment within a circuit of unfolding, 2) "genetic passivity" in which the "decisive now" does not elapse but persists as a structural dimension in which each sedimented event within an environment is folded into new possibilities of behaviors of the body, but is still a constituting activity in a circular relationship between body and environment, and 3) "generative passivity" which draws upon a past that had never been present before it becomes, through an interplay of sense and nonsense (which is not a negation of sense, but just not yet having meaning). There is no preexistent meaning or form other than that they can be seen retroactively as having been. There is a latency or an incompleteness, an aporia, that is a hollow of the organism allowing an openness to the interplay of things around it.

As one can see, each of these three notions of passivity is more radical than the preceding one and works towards Merleau-Ponty's idea of a "time before time" that is distinctive of institution in which becoming happens among structures in such a way that, as Beith says, "this originary past is thus not elapsed, but neither is it determinatively present. It rather marks out a radical difference and openness to becoming, a generative passivity, in and between existing dimensions of sense" (11). The idea of generative passivity, concludes Beith,

undermines the whole idea of constitution by proposing the concept of institution whereby life continually accumulates sense through a movement between sense and nonsense, a movement that difficultly calls into question our ideas of 'past,' 'nature,' and 'origin'. (15-16)

Generativity passivity leads into Beith's conclusion that human consciousness is not privileged because this emergence of sense through the embodied interplay with the world underlies any conscious grasp of the world, and leads him to explore next the problem of organic form not as a possession of the organism, but again as an institution of sense that is dynamic and open-ended, emergent within an interplay within the environment. Beith's conclusions in this chapter and the next help the reader understand even more keenly Merleau-Ponty's emphasis on "interanimality" between humans and the animal world in his 1956-59 lectures on nature.

In "Consciousness and Animality: The Problem of Constituting Activity in The Structure of Behavior", Beith details how Merleau-Ponty's first work is usually interpreted as a criticism of both human consciousness and vital awareness as "transcendental, world-constituting activities," instead presenting them as a "living environmental relationship," or back and forth with the environment that is what is meant by genetic passivity. The organic structure of behavior is reciprocally activity and passivity, and the past is continually sedimented into the present as there is a continuing unfolding of the sense between organism and environment. Beith, however, feels this reading of Structure fails to capture its radical edge that Merleau-Ponty will spend the next decades articulating more fully. I agree with him even though, as he admits, there are inconsistencies in the book and Merleau-Ponty has not yet developed the vocabulary he will later use to describe generative passivity and its temporality. However, the logic of generative passivity in which form is not pre-given, nor self-constituting, but instead is always developing in being taken up from a latent past, which was not yet present, as an open-endedness, is suggested at times throughout Structure. Form is characterized as part of a circuit in which all parts interrelate. Beith states, "In The Structure of Behavior . . . form is in the first place a reality that appears, rather than one that is known. Form is not an object of consciousness, but marks the very transformation that is coming to consciousness" (32). Form is a becoming, and one that emerges as an interplay among beings.

Beith then argues against those who take Structure as making consciousness central by interpreting the melodic unfolding of vital structures and of symbolic structures in the human dimension as indicating the synthetic activity of consciousness in perception bringing together themes of sense. Beith disagrees by countering that "the hypothesis of The Structure of Behavior is also that consciousness itself is a structure or dynamic form, founded in the natural world" (25). Consciousness emerges in the lived participation in structures of nature through borrowing and learning from encounters with other beings. This means that consciousness itself is an emergent reality. This idea is indeed what Beith claims of Merleau-Ponty as offering "a 'radical revision' of the idea of consciousness from the perspective of the phenomenologist" (29). Structures emerge through embodiment's motor engagement with reality. This taking consciousness itself as "emergent, becoming, and diacritical" is certainly Merleau-Ponty's innovative turn in philosophy. After thousands of years of the Plato-to-Hegel tradition taking consciousness as self-contained, self-subsistent, and what placed humans above the rest of the beings of the planet, Beith correctly asserts that Merleau-Ponty's thought leads to the realization that "Consciousness gains sense only in a circuit of exchange with other existences" (37).

Another outcome of Beith's analysis of Structure that is equally radical (although a further articulation of Bergson's assertions) is that truth itself is always a becoming. In mechanistic explanations of the natural world and the birth of its sense or in vitalistic explanations of the natural world's unfolding, meaning is caused by prior conditions and it is a realization of something that was already, even if only potentially. However, the logic of institution says that the "life exhibits . . . a becoming-true" (44). As Beith puts it, "sense-making" happens "between different events. . . prior to bodies, persons, and histories that it institutes" (48), such that what comes to be also marks the emergence of what can now be taken to be its past and its antecedents. This radical structure of becoming is encompassing: Beith sees that Merleau-Ponty's thought leads us to see structures themselves as continually emerging and transforming, rather than being static and underlying phenomena, that the activity and passivity of organisms are inseparable and unfolding in time as an ongoing process, and that even consciousness itself and the natural world are an intertwined process ever transforming and open-ended as caught up in interplays outside themselves.

These are the themes of the next chapter, since Beith rightly states that these ideas suggested by Structure in certain passages are only worked out in the later works of Merleau-Ponty, especially in the lectures of the 1950's on passivity and then even later on the status of the natural world. Yet, Beith is correct in reading Merleau-Ponty's work by claiming, "Merleau-Ponty's philosophy culminates in the logic of institution" (55). From the Phenomenology of Perception onwards, Merleau-Ponty has been working out a different articulation of temporality more radical than Husserl's in which there is a past which has never been present. This means that possibility must be rethought not as logical possibility which somehow pre-exists the present but instead must do justice to "the retroactive generation of sense as the temporality of nature" (55). To render form itself as emergent means that it occludes its being grasped since it continually becomes (62), and the melodic unfolding of existence always exceeds what has been (70). In this way, Merleau-Ponty is faithful to Bergson's insistence that we see time as the ongoing birth of novelty.

However, this open-ended interplaying means that embodied consciousness is not self-contained nor are form and structure merely givens in the world, but rather there is a playing off among different beings in diacritically adding to the sense that comes to be (57). As Beith correctly concludes about the difference in Merleau-Ponty's approach to both the body and sense: "While the body is not a power of self-effecting, its ontological incompleteness is a potency (puissance) to become meaningfully oriented in new ways" (66). This is what Merleau-Ponty means by calling the body a "hollow" throughout his later works: meaning can inexhaustibly come to emerge though the incompleteness of whatever has evolved biologically, behaviorally and in the realm of meaning-making. This generative passivity and institution happen since there is a different temporality: "past and present are not separate, successive entities, but dialectically unfold together" (70). Rather than a linear, successive time, the past and present can only be thought of together as instituting a matrix of sense (84). The natural world gets "played out" between that which has attained sense and that which has not, as generating new sense (94).

In the next chapter, Beith considers the genesis of the person as a further consequence of generative passivity as suggested by the Phenomenology of Perception. Given what has already been established, the structure of personhood will not be a rational or static or self-subsistent phenomenon, but rather an emergent sense acquired through the relationship of body and world in a "perceptual-motor learning" (102). Key to this analysis is seeing habit as the ongoing acquisition of domains of significance that is an institution -- that is a becoming of a past that has never been, a drawing upon a latency of sense that habit allows to be open to its further unfolding. As habits are enacted, this is "an expression of 'my very self'" (103). Habits as perceptual-motor responsive activity are "played out" with the world and within time: "As modes of activity, habits take time, and, crucially they cannot occur with a single 'event,' but are a process that takes place between events" (110). Again, however, Beith draws out this other notion of time, to emphasize that this does not mean that habit is a past lingering, but rather it is a coming-to-be of bodily temporality in which there is a "zig-zagging" (115) between past and present in which the past is a coming to be true continually. This past exceeds our personal past and plays off the absolute past of a nature we can never grasp, but whose traces are tendencies we come to see later and is at the heart of who we are (117).

In the final chapter, Beith works out what the logic of institution means for the sense of agency, politics and psychology, and ends with a brief note on the ethical implications of these ideas. The previous chapters have demonstrated that instead of thinking of the past as offering meaning only through continuity of sense, in some ways it is the divergence from the past which in this interplay generates new meaning. It is the divergence with others in their ways of occupying space and acting that gives us the sense of them, and it is the future working against the past and present that generates new sense. Throughout the book, Beith has deftly shown that Merleau-Ponty's work makes sense only by seeing the body as part of a field of sense-making and this means that the liberal idea of self-enclosed rational individuals is at odds with this entire analysis of how meaning emerges from the material, organic and human world. Beith concludes that we are the ongoing emergence of "intercorporeal institution" such that "the prepersonal, interbodily, communicative context in which personhood is initially accomplished and continually enacted . . . [is] the generative matrix of personhood" (143) and also of community.

Again, this happens on a bodily level most basically, as gestures are "definitively shared" (152) and "all action is symbolic" (152). In other words, the kind of internal bond that Merleau-Ponty showed among infants in their sense of their bodies and being hasn't left us as adults and we emerge in and through others on a preconscious level and one that is similarly an instance of institution or the temporality of becoming, where possibilities are not pregiven, but emergent. If this is true, then Beith suggests, this has an ethical call to be open to others in a "responsive courage" (163) that is sensitive and graced with humility in order to allow our shared meanings and future actions to emerge in an open interplay among us. I applaud Beith for this conclusion, as I do for his carefully written book. I also am one of the few commentators who believes Merleau-Ponty did spell out an ethics, but one that is radically different than the tradition of ethics from Plato to current ethical theory. Merleau-Ponty's ethics occurs at a lived level, a pre-reflective perceptual-emotional-imaginative level of openness to encounter, dialogue and shared action with others.