The Blackwell Guide to Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics

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Richard Kraut (ed.), The Blackwell Guide to Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, Blackwell Publishing, 2006, 384pp, $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 1405120215.

Reviewed by Marco Zingano, University of São Paulo


This is a most valuable book. Edited by Richard Kraut, it has sixteen chapters, all written by researchers who are currently working either on Aristotelian ethics or on topics of Ancient ethics closely related to it, and who have all recently published important contributions to the subjects they are analysing in this edition. The chapters cover almost all important points of the Nicomachean Ethics, giving the reader quite a good idea of its contents and achievements. As a guide to Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, this book fulfils perfectly well its aim; in fact, it goes farther than that and deserves careful study from all scholars, for it engages itself in an appraisal of Aristotelian ethics, as should be expected from a book written by philosophers.

After Kraut's introduction, in which he summarises all the contributions, the guide begins with a chapter on the Aristotelian Ethical treatises by Chris Bobonich ("Aristotle's Ethical Treatises"), in which he tries to assess the links NE has, notably towards the Protrepticus and the Eudemian Ethics. The other chapters in the order in which they appear in the volume are: "Human Good and Human Function", by Gavin Lawrence; "How to Justify Ethical Propositions: Aristotle's Method", by the guide's editor, Richard Kraut; "The Central Doctrine of the Mean", by Rosalind Hursthouse; "Aristotle on Moral Virtue and the Fine", by Gabriel Richardson Lear; "Aristotle on the Voluntary", by Susan Sauvé Meyer; "Aristotle on Greatness of Soul", by Roger Crisp; "Aristotle's Justice", by Charles Young; "Aristotle on the Virtues of Thought", by C. D. C. Reeve; "The Practical Syllogism", by Paula Gottlieb; "Akrasia and Self-control", by A. W. Price; "Pleasure and Pain in Aristotle's Ethics", by Dorothea Frede; "The Nicomachean Account of Philia", by Jennifer Whiting; "Aristotle's Political Ethics", by Malcolm Schofield; "Aquinas, Natural Law, and Aristotelian Eudaimonism", by Terence Irwin; and a final chapter "Aristotle and Contemporary Ethics", by Sarah Broadie.

The first chapter considers Aristotle's various ethical treatises. After that, the order of the essays, up through Schofield's, follows that of the topics treated in NE. Schofield's essay suitably reconnects with the beginning of NE by locating ethics inside the branch of politics (or, as Schofield frames it, by taking "just one sphere -- politics -- conceived in ethical terms", p. 305). Of the last two essays, Irwin's deals with the medieval fortunes of NE, or, more precisely, what we can learn from Aquinas about Aristotle's conception of happiness as the ultimate end of a rational agent. Broadie's deals with the differences between Aristotle and contemporary ethicians, arguing that, for all the illuminating power Aristotle brings to contemporary discussions, a guide to Aristotle's moral philosophy is not a guide to contemporary ethics.

NE has a complex structure and one can always complain that some points are missed. One can regret, for instance, that this guide considers only greatness of soul since other particular virtues are worth investigating, especially courage, both for its central role in ancient morality and for the problem of the different kinds of courage that Aristotle discusses. Nonetheless since greatness of soul is treated in one chapter and justice in another, the volume covers the particular virtues fairly well. Some other points, though, seem to require scrutiny even in a volume that does not pretend to be exhaustive. Take, for example, Aristotle's criticism of Plato's Idea of the Good, for embedded in that criticism are some notions crucial for establishing ethics as a philosophical discipline. And not only ethics: whatever the Aristotelian doctrine of the unity of human good is exactly, it has deep connections with his solution to the problem of the unity of being, so that, in some sense, the destiny of ontology is forever linked to the birth of ethics. Admittedly this problem is more compelling in the Eudemian Ethics, so that it is not so surprising that it is not specifically treated in a guide focusing on the Nicomachean Ethics rather than Aristotelian ethics in general. But Bobonich's opening chapter shows such sensitivity to questions of this sort that the reader justifiably expects that some of them will be addressed -- and this one surely deserves close attention.

But certainly more important than noticing what is missing is getting a general idea of the volume's overall strategy in dealing with the central topics of NE. Not two decades ago war still raged on the question of whether Aristotle committed a fallacy in the very beginning of NE (I 2 1094a18-22), when, allegedly, he tried to derive only one end for everything from the fact that everything tends to an end. Geach later identified the same fallacy in other thinkers. Gavin Lawrence makes just two brief remarks about the alleged fallacy, the second one, "it turns out to be virtually non-controversial that there is such a good" (p.45). A. W. Price makes a still briefer allusion to the issues when he refers to "the end of ends of action" (p. 234). This stormy debate was closely connected to the problem, first framed by Hardie, of determining whether eudaimonia was an inclusive or a dominant end. This second discussion focused on the analysis of I 7 1098a16-18, notably on the meaning of teleiotatên. The present volume has only a few references to this passage: one by Reeve (p. 205); a second (merely an allusion) by Crisp (p. 162); and a third by Jennifer Whiting, who mentions the controversy, but rightly avoids examining it, as the points she wants to make about friendship do not depend on it. Lawrence, however, treats the issue at some length (pp. 59-61): according to him, teleiotatên has a particular meaning, whereby it picks out one virtue among others. Such a reading is compatible with a focal structure within human excellences, where one excellence (practical wisdom with its accompanying practical virtues) is for the sake of another (contemplation). This reading does not rule out the possibility of a certain kind of comprehensivist thesis, according to which the act of contemplation has to be chosen, so that, in addition to realizing the excellence of contemplating, we have also to assess the question whether in contemplating we are thereby acting well, and for this latter assessment practical wisdom is required. All this is very reasonable, and Lawrence's argument is convincing.

This discussion puts one back into the middle of another, already ancient, battle between the contemplative life and the practical life. This third controversy lurks behind all of the papers, though it has surely lost much of the fierce antagonism with which (even recently) it used to be expressed. That discussion divided commentators into two opposed camps: the inclusivists and the exclusivists or monists. It seems now that it has lost some of its urgency, perhaps because all possible readings had become so entrenched that the whole discussion threatened to become barren. Lawrence's stance, in any case, moves toward a compromise that attests to a change in the interests that guide contemporary readings of Aristotelian ethics. Instead of locating Aristotle in some pigeon-hole either for or against some modern position, what seems most important now is understanding how Aristotle managed to put rationality at the core of moral decisions -- and to do so in a way that does not lead to "a law conception of ethics" (to use Anscombe's famous phrase, discussed by Irwin, p. 325), but instead to a virtue ethics, in which deliberation on circumstances cannot be assimilated to a deductive pattern of reasoning, and in which the prudent man has a most prominent place. Taken as a whole the volume's essays provide not only a very competent guide to the status questionis, but also a timely indication of new horizons for, and new perspectives on, a much debated issue.

The sixteen chapters, each written by a different author, cannot be reviewed as a whole. Accordingly, I will focus on just one topic that is in some sense implicit in all ethical enquiry. This is the problem of method in ethics. In his essay on this topic, the editor, Richard Kraut, strongly argues for a dialectical method. According to him, the endoxic method "is a general method, not one to be used solely for investigating ethical topics." (He is not alone in this view; the volume's authors seem to take the endoxic method as the official Aristotelian method, at least for ethics. Susan Sauvé Meyer, moreover, explicitly expands it to other disciplines, saying that dialectics is Aristotle's "general philosophical method" (p. 142). In any case, I will focus solely on its place in ethics, leaving aside the question of whether it can be expanded to other scientific disciplines. Their dialectical character does not diminish the strength of ethical proofs. As Kraut argues, Aristotle sees no reason for a lower standard of justification in ethics. On the contrary, all Aristotle asks us is to conceive of ethical proof as using a different standard of justification: neither mathematical pinpoint accuracy, nor rhetorical persuasion. To quote Kraut: "although ethics must be judged by the same endoxic method used to prove truths in every other field, we should recognize that it is a field in which some of what is shown to be true holds only for the most part" (p. 87). Otherwise stated, ethics must content itself (at least in part) with generalizations always open to exceptions. That sounds quite reasonable, for there are many hints of dialectics operating throughout NE. Taking it for granted that problems of accuracy primarily apply to "for the most part" generalizations (and not also or primarily to cases much more difficult to deal with, such as "this is what has to be done in those particular circumstances"), one could still ask how ethics will distinguish itself from natural sciences. For natural sciences work also with truths that hold only for the most part, and that are framed in generalizations always open to exceptions. One possible reply is that this is not really an objection, for those who hold that ethics, as well as other disciplines, are dialectical, look towards bridging the gap between ethics and natural sciences. But some doubts remain. Kraut himself tries to get around one of them. Is not such a method too conservative? For if ethical proof relies on reputable opinions, hence on opinions already held, how can there be any novelty in ethics? His answer: "this charge of conservatism overlooks the fact that Aristotle himself -- or anyone else who is studying ethics and proposing an ethical theory -- has standing as someone whose views are reputable and should therefore be included among the endoxa" (p. 92). That's a possible answer -- but one with a particular slant. For if someone has a position to defend, why does he need to include his own position among all those others opinions in order to provide a proof for it? Why can't he prove it directly? By including his own opinion among all others, our student of ethics will surely manifest his willingness to consider any idea of another person, even if it appears to him to have no plausibility. That's very kind of him, but why should such willingness be a condition for proving his own thesis? Kraut writes that Aristotelian arguments and premises "should be seen as part of the material to which the method is applied" (p. 93). But this method is the Aristotelian method. So Aristotle has thesis a, but in order to prove it, he himself proposes to put it among b, c, d, and n and then try to get a back. This is very generous, but it seems otiose as a justification of a: the reasons which made him adopt a are the same that will justify, in his mind, adopting a.

Dialectics as a method in ethics seems in fact to put the philosopher in a neutral position: his stance is not one of the opinions in dispute, but is rather the outcome of the harmonizing, as long as this is possible, of the conflicting opinions. That is what most probably happens with akrasia in Book VII. Aristotle's position is not one of the opinions to be preserved. It derives rather from the attitude of preserving all the opinions involved or, at least, most (and the most authoritative) of them. Perhaps this position is too conservative. But the question is: is this an appropriate method for discovering truth in practical matters? I cannot here pursue this question further. Let me just stress one point. The most important declaration in favor of dialectics as the method in ethics is found in the opening lines of the enquiry on akrasia. Kraut quotes this passage (VII 1 1145b2-7) in the very beginning of his discussion. But Book VII is common to both the Eudemian and the Nicomachean Ethics. And, as one can gather from Bobonich's opening chapter, it is not implausible that the common books belong primarily to the Eudemian Ethics. On the one hand, the Eudemian Ethics consistently puts forward dialectics as a method for ethical proof -- and if Book VII is primarily an Eudemian book, it is just reiterating this point with all its clarity and strength. On the other hand, when we look for remarks on method in the books that certainly belong to NE, outside the common books, what one finds is a consideration of ethical exactness, in contrast to both mathematical accuracy and oratory persuasion. Despite these contracts, ethical exactness is surely aimed at truth -- practical truth, to be sure, but truth nonetheless. Whatever truth it is, one learns from NE X 8 that "truth in practical matters is judged on the basis of the facts and of life" (1179a17-22, quoted by Kraut, p. 90). Fact is a translation for ergon, and ergon cannot be so easily assimilated to endoxon. Questions of accuracy can be made compatible with questions treatable by the dialectical method, but they are surely not the same, and the fact that the vocabulary in which the first kind of questions is expressed is totally absent from the Eudemian Ethics suggests that the the two kinds of question are more probably in contrast than in harmony. So something seems to change when one passes from EE to NE, or vice versa. Perhaps the method of ethics is not something Aristotle defined once and for all, thus allowing us to navigate between the two treatises without any problem. Perhaps, on the contrary, the method of ethics is a problem whose formulation (and, possibly, solution) sheds some light on the relationship between the two treatises, whether one takes dialectics as the final answer (so that EE becomes the more mature or more interesting text), or one suspects that Aristotle eventually had reasons to deny that an ethical view is more strongly proved the more opinions that it saves (so that NE, excluding the common books, asks us to reopen the question, even if only in a tentative way).

Whatever the answer to this last question, this guide presents a very important contribution to a better understanding of the aims and arguments of the Nicomachean Ethics, through its clear and thoughtful analysis of a number of important questions. Any serious student of Aristotle's philosophy will find here a valuable guide for interpreting central ethical questions posed by NE.