The Blackwell Guide to Mill's Utilitarianism

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Henry R. West (ed.), The Blackwell Guide to Mill's Utilitarianism, Blackwell Publishing, 2006, 275pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 1405119497.

Reviewed by Daniel Jacobson, Bowling Green State University


This volume comprises four sections, including one that gives the complete text of Mill's Utilitarianism. Although that work was first published serially, in three consecutive issues of Fraser's magazine -- a popular journal Mill privately disdained but occasionally used to reach a broad audience -- it was altered very little in subsequent editions. Hence, one edition is basically as good as the next. I will therefore focus exclusively on the other three sections of the volume: twelve essays that provide historical and biographical background to the work, canvass issues of its interpretation, and consider theoretical developments in utilitarian moral theory. Most of my attention will be directed to the interpretive essays, the most crucial to the success of such a guidebook. A short and helpful introduction by the editor, Henry West, places these essays in context and offers some basic definitions for readers unfamiliar with philosophical terminology. The essays are mostly well chosen for their purpose, though (with a few exceptions) not exactly in the vanguard of Mill scholarship. With that caveat, I can recommend the volume as a valuable introduction to the work.

Yet one basic question, perhaps the crucial issue for a scholarly companion, goes unexplored in this collection. That question concerns the status of Utilitarianism: the work's place in Mill's thought and in the history of philosophy. Its influence can hardly be doubted, of course, and its pedagogical role is equally secure. The issue is whether Utilitarianism elaborates Mill's own moral theory, or if it had a different and considerably more modest aim. I believe that the most fundamental disputes over the interpretation of Mill hang largely on this question. Some scholars take the famous "proportionality" version of the greatest happiness principle (hereafter GHP), given in the second chapter of Utilitarianism, to be the official statement of Mill's moral theory. This conventional interpretation of Mill tends to portray him as an orthodox utilitarian who attempts, heroically but in vain, to accommodate the sphere of rights demanded by classical liberalism. Alternative approaches take more seriously the inconsistency of so much of Mill's work with the standard consequentialist criterion of rightness as the maximal promotion of the good. The question then becomes why Mill seems to endorse this consequentialist moral theory in Chapter 2 of Utilitarianism, the putatively definitive statement of his view.

The issue of Utilitarianism's importance has been surprisingly overlooked, or at least underplayed, given the ample evidence that it was not anything like the utilitarian "bible" for which Mill evangelized, as Roger Crisp has characterized it.[1] On the contrary, there is ample reason to doubt how much importance Mill placed upon this work, notwithstanding its subsequent canonization. To put the question most sharply, should there even be a Blackwell Guide to Mill's Utilitarianism, alongside its guides to Plato's Republic, Descartes' Meditations, Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, and the like? (While this question applies far more broadly than to one publisher, it should be noted that Blackwell has a forthcoming Guide to Kant's Ethics, rather than specifically to the Groundwork, presumably for just the analogous reason.) The answer, I think, is no. This "little work," as Mill referred to it, with its questionable pedigree and expressly modest ambitions, has assumed an oversized reputation. Indeed, the prerequisite for finding a consistent interpretation of Mill is to grasp his limited aims in Utilitarianism and, in particular, to appreciate the ecumenical nature of GHP. If Mill merely intended to set forward a common "creed" on which all the classical Utilitarians could agree -- albeit by equivocation over its exact meaning -- then GHP should not be taken as the official statement of his own theory, but as a deliberately vague statement of the doctrine uniting the diverse Utilitarian movement.[2]

Although this crucial issue is never directly broached in West's volume, its ramifications can be seen throughout the essays. For instance, John Skorupski contributes an excellent article, "Utilitarianism in Mill's Philosophy," which places Mill's utilitarian commitments within the framework of his overall philosophy. This essay, along with useful articles by Susan Leigh Anderson on the basics of Mill's biography and Gerald Postema on Bentham's utilitarianism, constitutes the first part of the volume ("The Background of Mill's Utilitarianism"). Since Skorupski is not beholden to Utilitarianism, he can properly characterize Mill as an empiricist, a liberal, and a utilitarian -- in that order. His summary of Mill's moral theory thus conflicts with the standard consequentialist criterion of rightness:

[Mill's] doctrine is that an action which breaches no other-regarding duty is never morally wrong, and his theory of moral duties is liberal, not rigorist. Nevertheless the justification for this liberal view, according to Mill, is utilitarian. The basic case for liberalism is that human beings achieve the most valuable forms of happiness under liberal morality and liberal law. (59)

This claim represents Mill's moral theory more accurately than does the conventional interpretation. Skorupski's essay provides much-needed philosophical background from other works that Mill himself considered more important than Utilitarianism, especially the System of Logic and On Liberty. This and Alan Fuchs' essay (to be discussed later) are the most significant contributions to Mill scholarship in the volume.

The discussion of value theory in Utilitarianism has always been the most tortuous aspect of that work. Mill makes several conflicting axiological claims: the official statement of hedonism; the obscure but clearly authentic doctrine of higher pleasures; and the thesis, crucial to his notorious argument for the principle of utility, that happiness can somehow contain such disparate things as virtue and money as essential "parts." Attempts to reconcile these claims almost always end in frustration or obscurity. Wendy Donner seeks a coherent doctrine in her essay, "Mill's Theory of Value," which succeeds at least in calling attention to the Aristotelian aspect of his conception of happiness. West's own contribution, "Mill's 'Proof' of the Principle of Utility," answers the least charitable objections to Mill's most famous argument. But these issues will continue to perplex readers of Utilitarianism until that work is given a more modest appraisal, and its claims are subject to a more liberal philosophical reconstruction. Or so I contend. But even if I am wrong in this admittedly contentious claim, the most interesting recent work on these topics that does focus primarily on the text of Utilitarianism is not surveyed in this volume, to its detriment.[3]

L. W. Sumner's contribution, "Mill's Theory of Rights," nicely summarizes the conventional view of both Mill's moral theory and his defense of rights. As Sumner archly notes, "Those who have not read to the end of Utilitarianism may be surprised to learn that John Stuart Mill has a theory of rights" (184). His implicit, and probably apt, assumption is that such readers know nothing else of Mill. Indeed, the fifth and final chapter of Utilitarianism, which was written separately, proceeds more ponderously than the first four brisk chapters; I suspect that many of my students, and perhaps some professional philosophers, fail to read it through. Unfortunately, readers who focus on the earlier chapters get a deeply distorted view not only of Mill's theory of rights but also of the basics of his moral theory. Sumner follows the conventional interpretation of Mill, however, by taking GHP to entail orthodox consequentialism. Yet the text of GHP does not clearly support this inference. Mill writes:

The creed which accepts as the foundation of morals, Utility, or the Greatest Happiness Principle, holds that actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness, wrong as they tend to promote the reverse of happiness. (Utilitarianism: II, 2)

Sumner infers from this passage, without argument, that in Mill's view, "[t]he right thing to do is always whatever will best promote that goal" (187) of maximizing the balance of happiness. Yet this conclusion seems less than adequately motivated, since the actual language of GHP does not imply this criterion but appears to deny that there will usually be any uniquely right act.

Nevertheless, Mill scholars do not often draw the conclusion that he thought there to be many right acts typically available, much less that any action that tends to promote happiness counts as one of them. In his essay, "The Scalar Approach to Utilitarianism," Alastair Norcross defends the radical alternative of giving up on rightness altogether. He suggests that utilitarians "reject the claim that duties or obligations constitute any part of fundamental morality" (223). This approach deserves further consideration, but it cannot be Mill's own view (as Norcross grants). Donner does gloss consequentialism as the view that "actions are right if they produce good consequences and they are wrong if they result in bad consequences" (118). But this claim is highly idiosyncratic and inconsistent with the conventional interpretation; moreover, it yields implausible verdicts in many contexts. Despite its resemblance to the letter of GHP, most philosophers reject this view as untenable, and most interpreters balk at attributing it to Mill. Instead, the proportionality language of GHP is typically understood to imply that the most right action should be taken as the sole right action. Yet Mill repeatedly endorsed supererogatory action (which exceeds the demands of morality), notwithstanding its intractable conflict with this orthodox consequentialist claim. Notably, although Mill defends supererogation throughout his mature work, he ignores the issue almost entirely in Utilitarianism -- further evidence that he deliberately avoids unnecessary internecine disputes in that work, as befits the defense of a common creed. (His defense of higher pleasures is a necessary dispute, by contrast, because Mill needs it to answer the objection that utilitarianism is a doctrine worthy only of swine.)

Sumner offers about as strong a defense of Mill's theory of rights as the conventional interpretation allows, and his essay is well worth reading. This position has the virtue of simplicity but the vice of undermining most of Mill's overt claims about the principle of liberty and the sphere of rights recognized by a free society.[4] Sumner posits a biconditional harm principle, on which social coercion can properly be applied only when, but whenever, the case involves harm to (non-consenting) others.[5] He writes, "It should be clear that the function of the harm principle is to confer on individuals a very extensive liberty-right: basically, the right to do anything they please as long as their conduct will not cause harm to others" (196). The trouble is that the sphere of liberty protected by such a harm principle would not be nearly as extensive as Mill requires, because almost any sort of action can be harmful. So understood, the harm principle would be both too weak and too strong to serve as a plausible justification and limitation on state interference with individuals: too weak because it rules out many of the obligations which a state can legitimately impose upon its citizens; and too strong because even self-regarding actions, which are protected from social coercion, can have some harmful effect on non-consenting others. In fact, Mill expressly notes both these points in On Liberty. Self-regarding acts are not always harmless, even to non-consenting others; and certain "positive compulsions" can properly be required by the state regardless of whether, in any individual case, their omission would be harmful.

The central problem in Mill scholarship has always been how to reconcile his avowed principles of liberty and utility. The solution to this problem hangs crucially on properly circumscribing his utilitarian commitments. If my take on GHP is correct, though, we should not be too concerned with its specific language. Neither Donner's idiosyncratic gloss nor Sumner's conventional reading should be understood as anything like an official statement of Mill's moral theory. This cannot be Mill's view because, as Fuchs and Dale Miller note, he explicitly adopts a metaethical account that ties judgments of right and wrong to coercion and punishment: to sanctions, especially the sanctions of the sentiments (both positive and negative, external and internal). Miller's essay, "Mill's Theory of Sanctions," offers a good introduction to this critical and underappreciated issue. But Miller stops short of investigating the most interesting aspects of Mill's sentimentalism, in my opinion, and focuses instead on the most utopian claims in Utilitarianism. Many philosophers are enamored of these romantic passages, which Mill tends to put in temporally distant and even religious terms; and they often seize on his idealized utopianism while neglecting his practical gradualism. Brad Hooker's contribution, "Right, Wrong, and Rule-Consequentialism," ameliorates this worry by exploring the advantages of an indirect moral theory, which makes the rightness and wrongness of actions depend on the acceptance utility of rules compelling certain types of action and prohibiting others. This position is closer to Mill's view than the conventional interpretation endorsed by most of the contributors to this volume.

However, I consider Alan Fuchs's contribution, "Mill's Theory of Morally Correct Action," to be the best short essay explicating Mill's moral theory. This essay suffices to make this volume not just pedagogically useful but important. While Fuchs cannot make his case conclusively, in part because of limitations of space, he nicely illustrates some of the shortcomings of the traditional interpretation of Mill. Not coincidentally, he does so mostly by adducing sources outside of Utilitarianism, especially from On Liberty and the System of Logic, as well as from the metaethical section of Chapter 5. Fuchs in essence routes around the worries about Utilitarianism by letting the traditional interpretation take its support from Chapter 2, and then overwhelming that argument with evidence drawn from elsewhere. This gets the right result, but it does not explain why Mill would not have been more forthright about his moral theory in what is supposedly its most developed statement. (In this review I have suggested how one might begin to fill in this lacuna.) But this is a quibble with an otherwise excellent essay.

I will end by considering one of the oldest and most familiar objections to utilitarianism: that the consequences of our actions, especially their remote consequences, are inevitably unknown. In his solid contribution to the volume, "Contemporary Criticisms of Utilitarianism: A Response," William Shaw calls this "the most common criticism of utilitarianism" (203) and contrasts it with supposedly deeper objections. Mill spoke to the issue repeatedly, including in Utilitarianism, but his discussion in "Whewell on Moral Philosophy" is most notable. There Mill observes that not just morality but also prudence requires an assessment of consequences. "Prudence, indeed, depends upon a calculation of the consequences of individual actions," he writes, "while for the establishment of moral rules it is only necessary to calculate the classes of actions -- a much easier matter."[6] This passage gives further evidence that Mill favored an indirect form of utilitarianism, which focuses on the (expected) consequences of action types. Mill effectively refutes Whewell's blunt skepticism by asking, rhetorically, "because we cannot foresee everything, is there no such thing as foresight?" ("Whewell," p. 180). But Hooker substantially sharpens the epistemological worry by noting this profound psychological truth: "Human limitations and biases might well make us unreliable calculators of the expected overall consequences of our alternatives" (235). In fact, Mill granted this point in criticism of his fellow utilitarian, William Paley, and it remains a deep and telling problem, especially since it gets corroboration from the ample evidence of pervasive bias in our thinking.

This conclusion is illustrated inadvertently by Bart Gruzalski's contribution to the volume, "Some Implications of Utilitarianism for Practical Ethics: the Case against the Military Response to Terrorism." There he argues, on consequentialist grounds, that the military overthrow of the Taliban was both objectively immoral and counterproductive to American interests. However, his argument manifests just the style of casuistry under the guise of consequentialism for which Mill excoriated Paley: "a writer, who, whatever principle of morals he professed, seems to have had no object but to insert it as a foundation underneath the existing set of opinions, ethical and political" ("Whewell," p. 173). Whereas Paley used ostensibly utilitarian reasoning to support the established morality of the Anglican church, Gruzalski employs it in service of the ideology of a self-described "national lecturer on non-violence" (vii). It comes as no surprise that Gruzalski engages in highly selective counting of consequences and displays great naivety about the available options and their likely results. For just one example, he remarks that "the Taliban had offered to turn bin Laden over if the US would supply evidence that he was involved in 9/11" (260), as if this were a serious offer. Throughout the essay, he engages straw-man antagonists rather than serious counterarguments. Ultimately Gruzalski's faith in his preordained conclusions, like Paley's, verges on apriorism. "The dynamics of retaliation guaranteed that the invasion of Afghanistan, given that many innocent people would be killed, would be counterproductive" (255, emphasis added), he writes. Somehow these dynamics do not apply to the terrorist attacks themselves, however, since he also claims that al Qaeda is stronger and better off now than when they were effectively collaborating with the Taliban to tyrannize Afghanistan.

An intellectually honest appraisal of these issues in utilitarian terms would be refreshing. But a less prejudiced assessor would find it hard to avoid a conclusion antithetical to Gruzalski's astonishing confidence in even his most tendentious claims, which he summarizes with the verdict: "All of this was foreseeable by late afternoon on September 11, 2001" (264). The dismal truth remains that we act under conditions of great uncertainty, in which the results of our most fateful decisions, let alone their counterfactual alternatives, are often obscured by their proximity as well as by our ideology. Thus the most common and obvious objection to utilitarianism ultimately proves to be the deepest.

[1] See Roger Crisp, Mill on Utilitarianism (London: Routledge, 1997), p. 7. Crisp remains the advocate of the conventional interpretation who most adequately faces up to its costs -- which are by any measure extreme, culminating in a dissimulation hypothesis about Mill's remarks on the demandingness of morality (ibid., p. 115).

[2] For argument supporting these conclusions, see my article, "J. S. Mill and the Diversity of Utilitarianism," Philosophers' Imprint 3 (2003), available at

[3] See Geoffrey Sayre-McCord, "Mill's 'Proof' of the Principle of Utility: A More than Half-Hearted Defense," Social Philosophy and Policy 18 (2001): 330-60; and Elijah Millgram, "Mill's Proof of the Principle of Utility," Ethics 110 (2000): 287-310. Two less recent but seminal essays on Mill's theory of value are given only cursory mention: Elizabeth Anderson, "John Stuart Mill and Experiments in Living," Ethics 102 (1991): 4-26; and David Brink, "Mill's Deliberative Utilitarianism," Philosophy & Public Affairs 21 (1992): 67-103.

[4] For argument against this reading, based both on textual evidence and theoretical considerations, see Daniel Jacobson, "Mill on Liberty, Speech, and the Free Society," Philosophy & Public Affairs 29 (2000): 276-309.

[5] Such a harm principle does not entail that social coercion always ought to be applied in such cases, all things considered, since its costs might outweigh its benefits. But someone so coerced would have no complaint.

[6] J. S. Mill, "Whewell on Moral Philosophy," in J. M. Robson, ed. The Collected Works of John Stuart Mill, Vol. X (Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1969), p. 180.