The Blackwell Guide to Plato's Republic

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Gerasimos Santas (ed.), The Blackwell Guide to Plato's Republic, Blackwell Publishing, 2006, 320pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 1405115645.

Reviewed by Richard Kraut, Northwestern University


This is a valuable collection of thirteen new essays. Each has something to offer readers who are already familiar with the vast literature on Plato's Republic, and yet they are accessible to advanced undergraduates who are beginning to make a careful and systematic study of the dialogue. It would therefore be an excellent choice for an upper-division or graduate seminar devoted to Plato's work. Other volumes that I would put into the same category are Julia Annas's An Introduction to Plato's Republic, T. H. Irwin's Plato's Ethics, and C. D. C. Reeve's Philosopher Kings. (At the risk of immodesty, but in the interest of full disclosure: the present reviewer is also the editor of an anthology of 13 essays on Plato's Republic. Unlike Santas's, all of its essays originally appeared elsewhere.)

The volume begins with "The Literary and Philosophical Style of the Republic" by Christopher Rowe. He introduces readers to the many options between which they must choose, as they work their way through the dialogue's difficulties. Should it be read as an independent work, and therefore in isolation from Plato's other writings? What are we to make of Plato's decision not to speak directly to his readers, in the form of a treatise, but indirectly, by means of dialogue? How should we understand the relation between Book I and the apparently fresh start that is made in the opening lines of Book II? Rowe holds that Plato used the dialogue form because he took his philosophical doctrines to be remote from the starting points of his expected audience, and sought a way to mediate the distance between them. He is sympathetic to the view that there is in Plato's dialogues a continuous "subterranean flow" (p. 8), linking them together, and containing their real message. Perhaps most striking among the ideas offered here is Rowe's claim that the accounts of the virtues proposed by Socrates are "not only provisional but (strictly) inaccurate" (p. 18).

Jonathan Lear's "Allegory and Myth in Plato's Republic" offers a subtle and thought-provoking reading of several elements of the dialogue that are usually not read together as a meaningful group. The theme of the essay is Plato's thesis that young people cannot distinguish what is an allegory (huponoia: literally "under-thought") from what is not. The stories they absorb have enormous staying power, but their deeper meanings cannot be grasped during childhood; they can at best be recovered in maturity. Cephalus, for example, has been spooked by tales about Hades. What we need, Plato proposes, is a healthy replacement for the myths that torment the likes of Cephalus -- namely, the tales of retribution and reward contained in the Myth of Er. In fact, as Lear emphasizes, a large portion of the Republic contains reflections on the role of myth in human experience. What the myth (or noble falsehood) of the metals is for citizens of kallipolis, the Cave is for readers of the dialogue: its purpose is to make us "uncomfortable with our entire mode of acquiring beliefs and values" (p. 35).

In "Socrates' Refutation of Thrasymachus," Rachel Barney notes that no one is satisfied with the arguments presented in Book I of the Republic. She is alluding not only to the complaints registered in Book II by the interlocutors themselves, but by contemporary students of Plato's dialogue. The arguments are somehow in need of repair: but precisely why, and what do their deficiencies tell us about Plato's larger purposes? In reply, Barney offers an analysis of Thrasymachus's conception of justice, and of the five arguments Socrates brings to bear against it. She is, to my mind, both insightful and generous in her analysis of their deficiencies. (Even students reading this material for the first time protest, against Socrates, that some experts -- athletes, for example -- are inherently in competition with one another, and in this respect "pleonectic".) She comes to the conclusion that Book I can and should be read both as a "trailer" and as a deliberate exercise in failure. The five arguments are programmed to fail because they do not teach us the essence of justice; even so, they are a "philosophically necessary preparation" that helps us "recognize justice when we encounter it" in Book IV (p. 59).

Plato's threefold division of goods and the thought experiment involving the ring of Gyges' ancestor are the principal topics of Christopher Shields' essay, "Plato's Challenge: the Case against Justice in Republic II". The task of the dialogue, as he reads it, is to show both that justice is good in itself and also a component of the best life. (His point here is that justice is not being commended on the basis of its effects -- neither its external rewards nor its internal mental consequences.) He also astutely notes that the famous ring that makes its bearer invisible is meant as an argumentative device in Glaucon's case against justice. That is, the story of the ring is meant to support a deep universal truth about human psychology, from which the merely instrumental value of justice follows. The defect in Glaucon's theory, Shields points out, is that it implicitly accepts a conception of justice, but does not argue for it, as it was meant to do.

In "The Gods and Piety of Plato's Republic," Mark McPherran notes that whereas the Socrates of the Euthyphro and Plato's other brief ethical works apparently can find no value in the traditional religious practices of sacrifice and prayer, the Republic carves out a place for divinities and their worship, even though the virtue of piety receives no separate discussion. (He takes Plato to equate piety with justice; so construed, piety is as much a cardinal virtue as justice.) Platonic divinities, McPherran suggests, are of two kinds: the forms themselves are divine, but Plato also countenances the existence of divine souls.

Gabriel Richardson Lear's essay, "Plato on Learning to Love Beauty," notes that the guardians-in-training of kallipolis must learn to love beauty in all of its manifestations, and since justice is beautiful, they must come to appreciate that virtue in its guise as beautiful. She takes Plato to locate our sense of beauty in the spirited part of the soul, and therefore (surprisingly) the love of beauty is a manifestation of our innate competitiveness, our hunger for admiration, praise, and honor. So, the reason why a guardian must learn to recognize and love the beauty (and not merely the goodness) of justice lies in the need to orient the whole soul, and not merely reason, in the right direction. We must, in other words, react to justice with both admiration and something akin to sensual delight, and not merely with rational approval.

In "Methods of Reasoning about Justice in Plato's Republic," Gerasimos Santas finds in the dialogue three competing theories about how to determine what justice is. First, there is the empirical method of Thrasymachus: since a city's laws constitute justice for that city, we need do no more, to discover what justice is, than find out what any given city counts as legal. Second, Glaucon proposes a contractual method: justice consists in whatever is decided by an agreement made by predominantly selfish people under conditions of scarcity. Third, Plato's own method is the one proposed by Socrates is Book I: it rests on the hypothesis that the chief good of anything that has a function is its functioning well. Here Santas draws upon the interpretation that he sets out more fully in his book, Goodness and Justice: Plato, Aristotle, and the Moderns.

Hendrik Lorenz's "The Analysis of the Soul in Plato's Republic" offers an admirably lucid introduction to its topic. He emphasizes the point that Plato is not merely positing three tendencies or categories of motivational influences, but something stranger: three separate psychic entities, each with its own mental life; what kind of mental life each has is barely sketched in Book IV, but more fully described in later Books. In his treatment of this later material, Lorenz makes a nice point about Plato's reason for locating the oligarchic man's principal drive in the lowest part of the soul: he does not merely make money as a means to satisfying his appetites; rather, he loves the very activity of making money. The essay ends with a discussion of whether, in Plato's view, the lower parts of the soul cease to exist, after the body has perished, or whether those parts, once properly disciplined, are always unified with reason.

"The Divided Soul and the Desire for Good in Plato's Republic", by Mariana Anagnostopoulos, explores the apparent conflict between (1) Socrates' thesis (Gorgias 468c) that everything that is pursued is desired under the guise of the good and (2) his insistence, at Republic 438a, that an appetite for drink is a motivational force whose object is drink, pure and simple -- not drink, on condition that it is good for us. As I understand her complex and difficult essay, it holds that, according to the Socrates of the Republic, every action -- but not every desire -- seeks its object on the assumption that it is good to attain.

David Keyt's "Plato and the Ship of State" offers an admirably close and careful reading of Plato's comparison between a rebellion on a hypothetical ship and the political condition of unhealthy cities (Republic VI 488a-489a). Keyt convincingly argues that this simile deserves as much careful attention from scholars and readers as has been given to the similes of sun, line, and cave. He notes that the simile of the ship must be construed as having argumentative (and not merely illustrative) force, and that there are important lessons to be learned from it about Plato's political philosophy and the larger project of the whole dialogue. The economic class, on Keyt's reading, must have a basis for evaluating the quality of its rulers, and this requires that they have the ability to use Socratic cross-examination to distinguish true from false guardians.

Two essays in the volume are devoted to the metaphysics and epistemology of the central Books. Michael Ferejohn's "Knowledge, Recollection, and the Forms in Republic VII" notes that the prisoners in the cave can name the shadows on the wall with reasonable success, and asks what explanation Plato can offer for their mastery of this skill. His controversial reply is that, for Plato, the acquisition of general concepts and mastery of general terms would not be possible for someone unless he had previously beheld the forms. On his reading, Plato holds that ethical expertise, and therefore a study of abstract entities, is a prerequisite of political leadership primarily because the ordinary acquaintance every language-speaker had with the forms underwrites the ability to make only the easiest among our decisions and practical classifications. Hard questions about what to do can be resolved only through philosophical inquiry.

Terry Penner's essay, "The Forms in the Republic," argues that Plato's aim, in positing such forms as goodness and beauty, is not to affirm the existence of an ideal case of goodness or beauty (the most good object, the most beautiful object), but rather to uphold the existence of entities that ground eternally true scientific laws. To defend his view, he proposes what might be called a "deflationary" reading of many familiar components of the dialogue; that is, he supplies a reading of the best known metaphysical passages of the Republic that requires no "self-predicational" assumptions, and no bizarre notion that there are degrees of existence or reality. Part of the motivation for Penner's campaign lies in his opposition to readings of the dialogue that attribute to Plato an impersonal outlook on ethical life -- readings according to which the highest praise that can be given any undertaking is that it is, like the form of goodness, absolutely good (rather than good for oneself).

A fine essay by Rachel G. K. Singpurwalla, "Plato's Defense of Justice in the Republic" completes the volume. She addresses herself to a problem raised by David Sachs more than forty years ago: Socrates' defense of justice seems to have nothing to do with ordinary justice. Socrates affirms, in Books IV and throughout, the great value of a unified soul; but even if we accept that thesis, what has this kind of justice to do with commonplace acts of justice, which are undertaken for the good of others? Singpurwalla surveys two kinds of answers that other scholars have offered as solutions to this problem, and then proposes a new approach. On her reading, Plato posits a human need to live in unity with others. Goodness, in fact, is some kind of unification; and so, in making our own souls a unity, and thereby doing ourselves great good, we also become unified with others, and thus achieve a great social good.

The Republic covers territory -- pleasure, gender, private property, the role of family life -- that are not examined in these essays. But there is a great deal to appreciate here. We should be grateful to Gerasimos Santas, and to each of the contributors to this volume, for the new light they have shed on Plato's masterpiece.