The Bloomsbury Companion to Bertrand Russell

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Russell Wahl (ed.), The Bloomsbury Companion to Bertrand Russell, Bloomsbury, 2019, 428pp., $170.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474278058.

Reviewed by Nikolay Milkov, University of Paderborn


Sixteen years after the appearance of The Cambridge Companion to Bertrand Russell (ed. Nicholas Griffin, 2003), we now have a second companion to Bertrand Russell, arguably the founding father of analytic philosophy. While the Cambridge Companion is largely an encyclopedic sourcebook of scholarship on Russell's theoretical philosophy, the Bloomsbury volume, edited by Russell Wahl, collects essays that represent a broad spectrum of recent trends in Russell studies. He differentiates this new collection, explaining that the Bloomsbury volume "strives to add something new to [the] body of literature, and so does not attempt to provide a comprehensive treatment to all of the issues involved with Russell's philosophy." (p. 5) This approach is fully warranted given the proliferation of Russell scholarship in the years since the Cambridge Companion appeared. Reflective of how this newer work is trending are recent collections of papers celebrating the centenary of Russell's Paradox, of the publication of "On Denoting", of Principia mathematica, and of The Problems of Philosophy.[1] Wahl's edition brings together essays that take account of these developments in Russell scholarship. This critical-historical cast of the essays carries over into the new collection's comprehensive bibliography, which Wahl conveniently divides into publications before and after 2000. He separates the chapters into two Parts:: "Russell in Context" and "Philosophical Issues."

While the editor of the earlier Russell Companion included little in the way of historical analysis, Wahl dedicates Part 1 to studies that shed light on the philosophical history of Russell's relation to (British) Idealism, Pragmatism, the Vienna Circle, Frege, Meinong, and Wittgenstein.

The lead essay in the historical section is James Levine's "Russell and Idealism." Levine argues that Russell's "engagement with, and reaction to, idealism is central to his philosophical development and helps to illuminate fundamental aspects of his post-idealist philosophy." (p. 18) Russell's own account of his early encounter with idealism as a student at Cambridge is, as Levine points out, not strictly reliable. Take, for example, the autobiographical narrative "My Mental Development," where Russell refers to "the precise moment [in 1894 when he realized that] the ontological argument is sound" and he "became a Hegelian." (p. 28) Levine correctly observes that it was Bradley, not Hegel, who argued this point. Levine also mentions that while Russell believed that Ward was a Kantian and Stout Hegelian, that was not really so. I would only add that Ward attended Hermann Lotze's lectures in Göttingen and later followed Lotze on many points.[2] Importantly, Lotze cannot simply be pigeonholed as a Neo-Kantian, or a Neo-Hegelian. Stout, on his side, was devoted follower of Franz Brentano, something that also brought Russell close to Brentano's acolyte Meinong.

In "Russell and the Pragmatists", Cheryl Misak discredits the myth that Russell was dismissive of pragmatism. It is true that between 1908 and 1912 he considered James's theory of truth, which ran counter to Russell's realism, "to be silly at best, dangerous at worst." (p. 59) Still, in Theory of Knowledge (1913), Russell deemed James "neutral monism" worthy of serious consideration despite his opposition to it. Russell's attitude to James changed, however, after being invited to Harvard in the fall of 1914, where he delivered a course of lectures. This change, a complete shift in perspective, is evidenced in The Analysis of Mind (1921), where Russell explicitly embraces a neutral monism. What's more, as Misak remarks, in that book Russell adopts "a pragmatist account of meaning, with focus on habits of action." (p. 69) An historically notable result of this new development in Russell's thinking is its influence on Frank Ramsey, who in 1927 confessed that his "pragmatism is derived from Mr Russell."[3]

Drawing on the marginal comments in Russell's copy of Frege's Grundgesetze and on the notes he made while composing his paper "Meinong's Theory of Complexes and Assumption," Bernard Linsky's contribution probes Russell's disputes with Frege and Meinong, with a view to determining what Russell learned from them. The impact of Frege is evident, above all, in Russell's adoption of the principle of mathematical induction. That Linsky found no marginal notes on Russell's copy of Grundgesetze near Frege's Law V suggests that Russell discovered the paradox of class-inclusion prior to his detailed study of Frege. At the same time, Russell transformed the mathematical functions that Frege used in logic into propositional functions and, ultimately, into functional relations.

Linsky further reports that "it is much more difficult than with Frege to identify particular views that Russell learned from Meinong." (p. 86) This applies with particular force to what Gareth Evans termed "Russell's Principle," according to which if we wish to grasp a proposition, we must be immediately acquainted with its constituents. Nonetheless, it is clear that in "Meinong's Theory of Complexes and Assumption" and, in more developed terms, in "On Denoting" Russell rejected Meinong's notion of the "subsistence" of non-existent objects.

Wahl's chapter on Russell's interaction with Wittgenstein in the years 1911-14 concentrates on two works of Russell produced during this period: the paper "On Matter" (in several variants), published only in 1992; and Theory of Knowledge, an unfinished book that had also appeared posthumously, in 1984. Inspired in part by the extreme form of Wittgenstein's scepticism, Russell composed "On Matter" mostly in the second half of 1912. In it he applied his famous conception of "logical constructions" to epistemology, according to which "matter can be defined entirely as a function of sense-data." (p. 103) The objects of the external world are no longer the interred entities that feature Russell's The Problems of Philosophy.

Russell's never-completed opus, Theory of Knowledge, has long been of both philosophical and historical interest. Russell abruptly ceased work on the book in June 1913, allegedly as a consequence of Wittgenstein's criticism. Russell scholars have devoted scores of articles and even books to exploring whether in fact Wittgenstein was the reason Russell abandoned the project and, if so, the specific critical argument that changed his thinking on epistemology. Wahl is undecided as to whether Wittgenstein's criticism was the pivotal factor or whether Russell dropped the study simply because his multiple-relation theory of judgment had grown implausibly complicated and open to objections that he could not meet. Wahl points out, however, that at the beginning of 1913 Russell "thought of logic as the study of complexes" but found himself confronted with "the Wittgensteinian concern that the complex cannot be named." (pp. 107, 109) I personally believe that exactly this later point brought with it those difficulties in Russell's project that he failed to resolve.[4] To be more explicit, Wittgenstein learned about these difficulties through his extensive discussion about logic with Frege in December 1912 when Frege (to remind the reader about the anecdote) "wiped the floor with him". In short, Frege's message was: logic cannot be built on complexes. In his critic of Russell's epistemology in 1913, Wittgenstein simply transported Frege's argument to Russell's book-project.

In an essay that explores the relation between Russell and the Vienna Circle, François Schmitz concentrates on Rudolf Carnap rather than Moritz Schlick, the presiding member of the Circle, who was much closer to Wittgenstein than to Russell. Schmitz points out the considerable differences between Russell and the members of the Vienna Circle. For example, Schmitz notes that Russell rejected Carnap's Hilbert-inspired conventionalist concept of logic and that Russell didn't share the radically anti-philosophical sentiments of the Viennese positivists. Schmitz adds to these divergences Russell's scepticism vis-à-vis the radical form of empiricism championed by the Vienna Circle. Moreover, Carnap's Aufbau project was much more wide ranging, extending to all the sciences, including, I would add, the "sciences of culture" which, according to Russell, are not open to such an approach. Eventually, Carnap held that "all the sciences constitute a unique body of knowledge: it is the thesis of 'the unity of science'." (p. 132)

In Part 2, Graham Stevens offers "a radical reappraisal of the theory of descriptions and its place in Russell's philosophy." Stevens contends that the theory of descriptions "was always intended to be a part of a wider project in the philosophy of language" (p. 179) and not, as Russell scholars have often asserted, of mathematical logic. Hence the true focus of Russell's theory, according to Stevens, is the semantics of natural language. On the strength of this reading, he argues that the philosophy of language is the foundation of Russell's philosophy tout court.

Stevens makes two further clarifications on Russell's theory of descriptions. Above all, Russell was widely seen as defender of the "ideal language philosophy". The latter, however, can be interpreted in two different ways. According to the first interpretation, ordinary language is deficient since it presents the world in an incorrect way. The second interpretation maintains that the logically perfect language unveils the authentic structure of ordinary language. Stevens adopts the second interpretation which confirms the claim that the theory of descriptions was part of Russell's philosophy of language.

Stevens further holds that the theory of descriptions conflates three distinct theories "which are in fact entirely independent of one another" (p. 195): (a) the first concerns a semantic theory according to which definite descriptions determine quantificational and not referential content; (b) the second is about a semantic theory according to which proper names have descriptive content; (c) the third was an epistemological theory which maintains that we know the world in two different ways -- by description and by acquaintance. Importantly enough, one can endorse (a) but not (b) (Kripke did this), (b) but not (a) (as Frege did), or (c) without endorsing (a) or (b) (Russell's position before 1905).

Gregory Landini discusses "Russell's Logic as the Essence of Philosophy", a refrain introduced by Russell in Our Knowledge (1914). Landini calls attention to the period in Russell's development between 1910 and 1916 as "the Principia era." (p. 206) During these years Russell produced The Problems (1912) and Our Knowledge, Principia's "natural sequel." The task of these works, Landini holds, is to introduce "an epistemology for the cp-logic [comprehension principle logic] of Principia." (p. 211) Russell abandoned this epistemology, and with it the notion of knowledge by acquaintance, by 1919 when he adopted a doctrine of neutral monism.

Landini makes the problematic claim that for Russell symbolic logic is "an informative science capable of studying all relational structures." (p. 208) Russell, however, openly declares in Our Knowledge (p. 243):[5] "It is in this way that the study of logic becomes the central study in philosophy: it gives the method of research in philosophy, just as mathematics gives the method in physics," no more. Even clearer on this point is Russell in the "Preface" to Principia Mathematica (p. vii) where he wrote: Symbolic logic "is a suitable instrument of reasoning. Without its help we shall have been unable to perform the requisite reasoning." (italics added) Philosophy, in its turn, is an autonomous discipline and cannot be replaced by this instrument, i.e., by symbolic logic, exactly as physics cannot be replaced by its research instrument -- mathematics.

I agree with Landini that, according to Russell, philosophy is a "science that studies all the kinds of necessity that there are" (p. 211); but I disagree with him "that logic, that is, cp-logic, is the essence of philosophy" (ibid.; italics added). This claim disregards the fact that, from 1903 until at least 1919, Russell persistently maintained that there are two kinds of logic that he clearly discriminated: symbolic logic, or what Landini calls cp-logic, and philosophical logic that alone belongs to philosophy (Our Knowledge, p. 67; Mysticism and Logic, p. 74). The task of the philosophical logic -- to discuss the indefinables of mathematical logic and of other disciplines, for example, of epistemology (Theory of Knowledge) -- is in no way identical to that of the symbolic cp-logic. "This is a pure philosophical task." (The Principles, p. xv) The philosophical logical forms are to be discovered in philosophical effort -- they are not supplied by symbolic logic.

The latter point brings us to an important side of Russell's philosophical logic. It proceeds in philosophical contemplations and deliberations. This characteristic of philosophical logic explains why Russell contended that

When everything has been done that can be done by method [i.e., by cp-logic], a stage is reached where only direct philosophical vision can carry matters further. Here only genius will avail. What is wanted, as a rule, is some new effort of logical imagination, some glimpse of a possibility never conceived before. (Our Knowledge, p. 245)

Unfortunately, this is a very difficult task (which is why Russell used to say "Logic is Hell") that is to be accomplished through a "direct contemplation of facts" that discards language (Analysis of Mind, p. 212) and symbolic logic. The structures brought to light by symbolic logic cannot help in this region despite the fact that the discoveries made by the philosophical logicians are articulable according to the rules of symbolic logic.

In "Sense-Data, Sensibilia, and Percepts," Wahl discredits the widespread belief that Russell introduced sense-data in order to advance epistemological foundationalism. Wahl also makes it clear that Russellian sense-data are not subjective, as is often argued. Russell first promulgated the notion of sense-data in the 1911 lecture "Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description." Soon thereafter, in "The Relation of Sense-data to Physics" (1914), he introduced the correlative term, sensibilia, which denotes potential sense-data not entertained by a subject. After 1919, adopting a neutral monism and with it the position that there is no "subject" to which there are "given" sense-data, Russell dropped the idea of "sense-data" for that of "sensations." Later still, in Human Knowledge (1948), "sensations" are jettisoned for "percepts." Challenging the received interpretation again, Wahl holds that Russell's revisions were not radical ones, that in fact "Russell still maintained part of the epistemological role of sense-data up to Human Knowledge. He also kept the spirit of construction." (p. 252)

In "Russell's Bridge," Dustin Olson and Nicholas Griffin focus on Human Knowledge, Russell's last major work in theoretical philosophy. Human Knowledge is chiefly an epistemological inquiry in which Russell declares categorically that logic "is not part of philosophy" (p. 5) and explores the relation between individual experience and scientific knowledge. Russell employs the bridge metaphor, Olson and Griffin's point d'appui, in the chapter on "Degrees of Credibility": "The edifice of knowledge may be compared to a bridge resting on many piers, each of which not only supports the roadway but helps the other piers to stand firm owing to interconnecting girders." (Human Knowledge, p. 413) As this passage reveals, Russell here rejected the divide between epistemological foundationalism and coherentism, propounding instead a hybrid position that can be termed "epistemic holism."

This view went hand in hand with Russell's claim that there are degrees of epistemic justification, which implies that knowledge cannot be defined with absolute precision. Even justified data are, on Russell's account, uncertain to some degree. Moreover, embracing a fallibilist epistemology, Russell assumed that "an individual may have more than one set of coherent beliefs. Sticking with the metaphor, one can build a number of bridges." (p. 293) Olson and Griffin underscore the fact that in recent decades many analytic philosophers (Susan Haack, Catherine Elgin and William Lycan, among others) rediscovered and adopted this position.

Olson and Griffin's most interesting and historically significant claim is that Russell's "bridge epistemology" extends to his entire philosophical method. The latter, they find, is based on the assumption that "Epistemic justification is not simply a matter of independent experiences or coherent belief sets; it is a conjunction of the two." (Ibid.) Even more at odds with the received view is Olson and Griffin's contention that Russell's epistemic holism traces back to his earlier works. In "The Regressive Method of Discovering the Premises of Mathematics" (1907), in particular, Russell pointed out that the "pillars of mathematics" -- its foundations -- are vague, and so are not certain. From them, however, the final well-formed and well-developed ideas of mathematics can be inferred. In this sense, the method of mathematics is progressive. The method of its justification, in contrast, is regressive since it starts from the clear and distinct well-developed ideas of mathematics and ends in a search of their foundations with ideas that are vague. The implication of this thesis is that one "is not to treat the logical premises as the piers from which the rational credibility of the other parts of the system is derived. That would be the traditional foundationalist understanding of an axiomatic system." (p. 298) Against it Russell had already advanced a holist model of epistemological justification in 1907. Olson and Griffin's conclusion is that "The methodology which Russell proposes in 1907, with the mathematical sciences in mind, is essentially the same as that which he advocates forty years later." (p. 300)

Olson and Griffin conclude that Russell's regressive method is "a nascent version" of "reflective equilibrium," the explanatory method first explicitly articulated by John Rawls in his Theory of Justice (1971), one that Rawls deployed as a means of critically examining competing propositions and principles with an eye to reaching a conceptual "equilibrium" between them. "It is just this type of examination," Olson and Griffin tell us, "that Russell defends in (1907) and (HK). It is also the method, once appreciated, readers can observe in action in much of Russell's philosophy." (p. 301)

I fully agree with them on this point. What remains to be added is that this interpretation of Russell can be also helpful in building another bridge: one between Russell's theoretical philosophy and his popular books and essays. It is a matter of fact that the rate of Russell's correct judging by examining states of affairs of social and political life -- marriage and morals, the outbreak of the Great War, the peace treaties after it, the theory and practice of Bolshevism -- was manifestly high. I suggest that this was the case, since in these regions, too, Russell applied the method of reflective equilibrium he adopted by explorations in theoretical philosophy.[6] A historical remark, I would like to add is that the difference between the regressive and progressive methods of producing knowledge was already formulated by Kant (i.e., in Jaesche Logic, § 117).

"Bertrand Russell's Moral Philosophy" by Ray Perkins, Jr. is a lucid and well-researched essay that commences with a discussion of Russell's "decade with the Moorean Good" (1903-13), when he adopted a form of ideal utilitarianism that conceives the good as an indefinable universal -- a view radically divergent from the hedonistic utilitarianism of J. S. Mill, who defined the good in naturalistic terms. Putatively under the influence of George Santayana, Russell, we are told, recast his moral doctrine in emotivist terms. Perkins distinguishes between Russell's early "proto-emotivism" of 1913-22, a middle-period emotivism of 1925-34 (which interprets "good" not as a name but a instead a disguised description), and the later more objectivist emotivism of 1935-45. The later position finds Russell emending his earlier views in ways that underscore the significance of universal and impersonal desires which are eventually fixed in moral and legal codes.

Regrettably, like the Cambridge Companion to Russell, this volume lacks a chapter on Russell's political philosophy, a historically significant area of his explorations. On the other hand, unlike the earlier Companion, this volume includes a valuable essay on "Russell's Literary Approach to History" by Peter Stone. It is well known that throughout his career Russell took an avid interest in history although he maintained that strictly speaking it makes no sense to speak of a "philosophy" of history. Unlike his positions in other areas, Russell's approach to history changed little over the decades. As Stone points out, Russell identified himself "with the so-called literary, as opposed to the scientific, approach" to the field. (p. 362) A formative influence on Russell in this connection was the Cambridge historian George Trevelyan, who, repudiating Hegelian and Marxist efforts at formulating causal or universal laws of history, argued instead for the pivotal role that the art of narrative plays in historiography. The value of history is educational; more explicitly,it helps to form better social and political judgment, "to teach political wisdom" (p. 366). Russell endorsed practically the same conception. He maintained, in particular, that "historical facts, many of them, have an intrinsic value, a profound interest on their own account. . . . [In contrast,] scientific laws in history are neither so important nor so discoverable as is sometimes maintained." (pp. 371-2)

There were some nuances in the theoretical stances of Russell and Trevelyan on this topic, however, that differentiated them. Above all, Russell maintained that although no such approach is viable today, it is not impossible that at some point in the future historians will promulgate some general laws. As a philosophical realist, moreover, Russell defended the idea of "truth" in history much more forcefully than Trevelyan. His short essay "On History", for example, starts with the claim that "History is valuable . . . because it is true." (p. 60). In general, however, concludes Stone, "Russell's efforts to defend a link between a commitment to truth and the literary approach to history are . . . less than successful." (p. 377).

I swon't give detailed reviews of the three remaining chapters only for reasons of space. In them Kevin C. Klement discusses "Russell's Logicism", Donovan Wishon explores "Russell on Introspection and Self-Knowledge" and Christopher Pincock Russell's "Neutral Monism". They all are well written and will surely stimulate reassessment of the standard interpretation of Russell's philosophy.

Overall, the volume is admirably produced: well-researched, well-balanced and well-written. It contributes significantly to our understanding of one of the most influential philosophers of the 20th century. While not encyclopedic, as its Cambridge predecessor, it effectively summarizes practically every major line of investigation in recent Russell studies. I personally enjoyed reading the volume, including those chapters on which I made polemical remarks, and learned a lot from it. As readable as it is informative, the volume deserves a place high on the reading list of both the student new to Russell as well as the seasoned professional philosopher.

[1] Cf. G. Link (ed.), One Hundred Years of Russell's Paradox, Berlin: de Gruyter, 2004; D. Jacquette and N. Griffin (eds.), Russell vs. Meinong: the Legacy of "On Denoting", London: Routledge, 2009; N. Griffin and B. Linsky (eds.), The Palgrave Centenary Companion to Principia Mathematica, Basingstoke: Palgrave, 2013; D. Wishon and B. Linsky (eds.), Acquaintance, Knowledge and Logic, Stanford: CSLI, 2015.

[2] Already John Passmore has noted that "Ward was a devoted Lotzean, whose philosophy incorporated science as one of its constituents." A Hundred Years of Philosophy, 2nd ed., Harmondsworth: Penguin, 1966, p. 82.

[3] Frank Ramsey, "Facts and Propositions", in: idem, Foundations, ed. D. H. Mellor, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1978, pp. 40-57, here p. 51.

[4] See N. Milkov, "The Joint Philosophical Program of Russell and Wittgenstein and Its Demise", Nordic Wittgenstein Review 2 (2013), pp. 81-105.

[5] Russell's quotations in this review are made according to the following editions: The Principles of Mathematics, London: Allen & Unwin, 1937; "On History", in: Philosophical Essays, pp. 60-9, New York: Simon & Schuster, 1966; Our Knowledge of the External World, 2nd ed., London: Allen & Unwin, 1926; Mysticism and Logic, London: Allen & Unwin, 1963; Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits, London: Allen & Unwin, 1948; with A. N. Whitehead, Principia Mathematica, vol. 1, 2nd ed., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1925; The Analysis of Mind, London: Allen & Unwin, 1921.

[6] For Russell as critical thinker, see Anthony Hare (ed.), Bertrand Russell and Critical Thinking, an issue of: Inquiry: Critical Thinking across the Disciplines 20 (2001). See also Bertrand Russell, The Art of Philosophizing & Other Essays, New York: Philosophical Library, 1968.