The Bloomsbury Companion to Political Philosophy

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Andrew Fiala (ed.), The Bloomsbury Companion to Political Philosophy, Bloomsbury, 2015, 271pp., $190.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847065544.

Reviewed by Mathias Risse, Harvard University


According to its publisher's website, the Bloomsbury Companions series "is a major series of single volume companions to key research fields in the humanities aimed at postgraduate students, scholars and libraries." In recent years about two dozen of these companions have appeared. The Companion to Political Philosophy is among the most recent additions. It consists of fourteen essays (stretching over about 220 pages). In keeping with the design of the series, the last two essays offer views on the possible future of the field. The twelve essays that discuss specific themes are on the history of political philosophy, sovereignty, cosmopolitanism, human rights, distributive justice, punishment, war, peace, liberal toleration, democratic theory, feminism and immigration. In addition, there is a chronology, a glossary, a list of research resources and an annotated bibliography.

Among the Bloomsbury companions, this one is among the slimmer volumes. The companions to epistemology, philosophy of mind, philosophy of science and philosophical logic are each longer (the latter comes to about 650 pages); even the philosophy of sports covers 480 pages. So in this comparative perspective one gets the sense that political philosophy has been shortchanged. This sense is also borne out as one makes one's way through this volume. I'm afraid I have to say the goal of this series as I quoted it above is not reached with this volume: this is not a volume for postgraduate students and scholars. Most of the articles are most plausibly read as having been intended for undergraduates who come to the subfield for the first time and seek guidance in coming to terms with its questions. Scholars are better off consulting the Blackwell Companion to Political Philosophy, edited by Robert Goodin and Philip Pettit (and in its second edition also by Thomas Pogge), or the Oxford Handbook of Political Philosophy, edited by David Estlund. To libraries, in all fairness to the alternatives on the market, one would have to give the same advice. If a publisher sees fit to sell a volume like this (again, 220 pages) for a solid $190 in hardcover and advertise it the way they do (for postgraduates, scholars, libraries), one would hope they produce something libraries have overwhelming reason to buy, if only out of consideration for the authors. And as we speak about the money charged for this volume I should also point out that a publisher who charges this amount for such a slim volume should be able to afford a proof-reader who would find the considerable number of typos and grammatical infidelities that found their way into print.

The concern here is in fact both with the choice and range of topics and with the level of the discussion. As far as the range of topics is concerned, one might be surprised to find no articles on topics such as ideal vs. non-ideal theory, race, historical injustice, freedom, contractualism, recognition, critical theory, Marxism, left-libertarianism, epistemic justice, territory, property or any kind of non-Western or even non-mainstream-Anglo-American approach even though there has been sustained interest in all of these (in some of them quite intensely recently). Global justice, one of the bigger topics in political philosophy in the last twenty years, has in recent times split into a number of more specialized areas. Some of them are represented (cosmopolitanism, immigration, sovereignty and human rights); but others could have been readily added, including environmental justice/climate change (only briefly covered under distributive justice), obligations to future generations, fairness in trade and justice in finance, but also the recent efforts in overcoming the statism/cosmopolitanism debate. None of that is here.

Accordingly, many of the younger people who have done the more exciting work in recent times (the kind of work that would take the field towards the future) are either not mentioned anywhere or are mentioned merely in passing. The authors often limit themselves to discussing the big figures in the field, as well as a certain range of literature that has influenced their own work. Genuinely comprehensive guidance to the topics is not provided. (I should add, though, in fairness to these authors, that the particular practice of quoting the work of elder statesmen and a mere select group of younger (<60) people is a disturbingly common feature of contemporary work of political philosophy and ethics, to such an extent that it's not surprising why younger people in these fields have such a hard time taking each other seriously.) Graduate students who would take their cues from this presentation of topics, and the manner in which they are treated, would not be well-served. Scholars who have worked on the topics in question in recent years would notice the shortfalls; I do not think what I am saying here is idiosyncratic.

So the question is: would this be a useful volume for undergraduates? I think it would be, and, again, my sense is that most of the authors saw their task as providing introductory texts catering towards the needs of interested undergraduates. Andrew Fiala offers a nice introduction to a set of topics surrounding "sovereignty" (in particular the development of the concept and its place in contemporary political and legal theory). If the volume had been truer to its stated intentions, one would have hoped the question of sovereignty would be more integrated with the recent debate between statists and cosmopolitans. Gillian Brock introduces the reader to the contours of cosmopolitanism and the questions it leaves open. Ideally, there should have been more recognition of the substantial criticisms the whole project of cosmopolitanism has encountered in the literature.

Ovadia Ezra offers a solid introduction to recent thinking about distributive justice that covers Rawls, Nozick, Ronald Dworkin, Amartya Sen and others and still manages to make some sensible references to global justice (though perhaps paying more attention to Pogge than the overall critical assessment of his work merits at this stage, a critical assessment that at the very least should have been acknowledged), as well as to questions about compensation for past injustice and environmental justice (issues that are covered respectfully here, but in light of the ambitions of the series would have merited their own articles). Curiously, though, Ezra starts with the Aristotelean discussion of distributive justice in the Politics and then makes a quick transition to the contemporary debate by pointing out that

One thing that has not been changed with regard to the usage of this concept is the comprehensive agreement that distributive justice refers to the way assets, goods, wealth, capital, resources, benefits, burdens, and so on should be distributed within political and social frameworks (p 75).

But this formulation refers to such a thin level of agreement between the Aristotelean view of justice and the contemporary debate that the sheer addition of the Aristotelean reference seems far-fetched without at least some additional explanations (or some reference, for instance, to Samuel Fleischacker's impressive 2004 A Short History of Distributive Justice). After all, what Aristotle was concerned with were the common holdings of the polis, as well as what the citizens collectively had to award; but there was no sense that shared patterns of production and coordination produce just about anything that is needed to get on in life (and that all participants in these activities had some substantial claim to their results). The path from the first though to the second was long and thorny.

Trudy D. Conway provides a hands-on account of different accounts of punishment, emphasizing the contrast between retributive and restorative accounts. What makes her account user-friendly is her effort to connect it to the struggles of real people to come to term with crimes. At the same time, the absence of any references to sophisticated utilitarian accounts makes the account somewhat wanting in comprehensiveness.

George R. Lucas, Jr. discusses war, doing a good job introducing ius ad bellum and ius in bello, putting everything into an informative historical context and offering some welcome references to non-European sources on the matter. What is startling, though, is the dearth of references to the recent discussion of war. Michael Walzer is mentioned, but Jeff McMahan, Francis Kamm and other contemporary figures are missing in action.

Andrew Fitz-Gibbon offers a relatively short article on peace following right after Lucas's piece on war. "Peace" is not a common subject for philosophical discussion. In art, peace and paradise, its transcendental cousin, are often described as states of affairs where nothing much happens. In this article, one gets a bit of a sense that the author was straining to find topics to bring under the heading of his title; so we find Gandhi's and Luther King's peaceful resistance mixed with accounts of pacifism and Kant's discussion of perpetual peace.

Robert Paul Churchill offers a solid discussion of liberal toleration, useful in its historical survey (focused on Montaigne, Bayle and Locke), but a bit stretched in the brevity of his references to the contemporary literature on toleration. In particular, one gets the impression that Churchill thinks Rainer Forst has an interesting contribution to make on toleration, but he never says enough about Forst or any other contemporary figure to make clear just what one would get into by taking a deeper interest in the contemporary debate about toleration.

Jacquelyn Ann K. Kegley talks about democratic theory. This article, more than any other, makes clear the extent to which this volume misses out on opportunities to make contact with non-Western literatures, surely appropriate for a volume on political philosophy published in 2015. A substantial amount of literature critical on Western notions of democracy has emerged among philosophers in the Greater China region (including authors such as Joseph Chan, Daniel Bell and Tongdong Bai), but one would never know from this article that "democratic theory" could include such critics.

Anca Gheaus contributes a very useful article on "Feminism and Gender," which is among the most effective in this volume. But while recognizing the quality of this article one must also, again, wonder why a volume on political philosophy published in 2015 would manage to include an article on gender whereas the only reference to "race" in the index that refers to more than a one-page passage is to the entry on "race" in the glossary. The following article by Shelley Wilcox on "Immigration and Borders" is equally well-done, though one cannot help but think that her take on the recent literature on immigration is highly selective.

All of these articles, despite their shortcomings, would offer a good way in to the questions at hand to the interested undergraduate student. And in all of these cases one senses that the author had this kind of audience in mind when they put together their article. The same is not true for James Alexander's article on "The History of Political Philosophy" and Siegfried Van Duffel's piece on "Human Rights." Alexander's article gets pride of place as the first article in the volume, and the title generates high expectations. But this reader finds himself rather perplexed about what this article aims to achieve. On the very first page, for instance, we are told that "politics, before the twentieth century, was always subjugated to something else -- to the polis, or to empire, church or state. But in the twentieth century, there were attempts to define politics (or the category of "the political") as something in itself." What such subordination of politics for instance to the polis would amount to is not explained. Schmitt, Collingwood, Arendt, and others then make an appearance. Next we are told -- backed up only by a reference to a 2014 piece by Alexander himself -- that "the consensus now, however, seems to be that politics has no simple meaning; it can mean more or less anything" (p 19). One does not know what to make of this.

Towards the middle of the article Alexander offers a reckoning with Rawls and Habermas, who are condemned for their lack of attention to history. But Alexander also points out that

Rawls lectured on Hobbes, Kant, Sidgwick, and others, while Habermas has written about almost everyone from Hegel to Derrida. But this has all been a lot less reflective, and lot less subversive, than the work of others -- such as Oakshott, Arendt, MacIntyre, Cowling, Dunn, and Geuss (p 25).

One must wonder along two lines. First of all, what kind of superhuman is supposed to work on questions of political philosophy in a respectable manner if Rawls and Habermas are falling short even though (a) the emphasis of their work is not historical in nature; (b) they are both demonstrably aware of the fact that political philosophy is much richer than what they themselves can provide; and (c) they both nonetheless offer an engagement with the history of political philosophy that along Alexander's own lines is non-trivial.

Secondly, one wonders about Alexander's judgment. His favorite authors have done important work, no doubt. But if I am eager to get a sense of how justice might sensibly apply to a pluralistic society where people live together who are also adherents to various understanding of the good life, I turn to Rawls, fully aware that historical understanding is not his forte. Do Oakshott, Arendt, MacIntyre, Cowling, Dunn and Geuss have answers to offer on this issue that compete with Rawls's, or are they simply offering different kind of work? If so (and that I think is the correct answer), what is the point of this sort of intellectual belligerence (that Alexander fully shares with Geuss, who is here quoted approvingly on just this matter, with apparently as little genuine evidence or argument)? In the end one is left with a sense that one meets an author with a lot of anger at how political philosophy is done these days and that the shortfalls have to do with how historical insight is integrated. But one does not quite know what the take-away is.

Van Duffel contributes a densely-argued piece on the contemporary discussion about human rights that is knowledgeable and insightful, but in its sheer density has a way of leaving even the scholarly reader behind. Van Duffel offers an effective introduction to the current "political" and "naturalistic" theories of human rights. The former understand human rights as part of current political practices and normally ascribe some kind of function in international affairs to them. The latter are clustered around the idea that human rights, one way or another, are rights we have in virtue of being human. These two approaches fall apart when it comes to assessing contemporary human rights practices. Assuming one thinks there should be one best understanding of human rights, the way to make progress would be to nominate a number of desiderata to which any theory of human rights should correspond and then to show that none of the available political or naturalistic theories can quite meet them all. That is what Van Duffel does.

Then he introduces a third kind of approach to human rights, the one he favors. "Rather than asking which rights we might have, I shall suggest that we might profitably ask which rights we think we have" (p 70). He calls this the "descriptive approach" and takes it to be its hallmark that we understand human rights as a "cultural phenomenon." He qualifies the potential of the approach right away, however: "The descriptive account is not interested either in affirming, or in rejecting the truth-value of normative claims. It does not deny that normative questions are important in their own right, but it leaves these questions aside" (p 71). He makes the connection to the normative theories by pointing out that these theories are the best sources for the requisite cultural knowledge about which rights we think we have. He also believes, however, that this descriptive approach is a way forward from the stalemate between political and naturalist theories. But given that a premise of the approach is that it would not help with normative questions, one wonders what potential Van Duffel's approach could have. On the face of it this approach has all the trappings of a problem declared to be a solution: perhaps this is a feature, but as a reader one really needs to know more to see if it is not in fact a bug. Based on what is said one cannot really judge, and perhaps a volume of this character is not the right place to offer this kind of theory. So one must hope that Van Duffel will be heard from again on this matter.

The last two articles discuss the future of the field. This is an unusual subject for a volume of this sort. One of these articles is by Matthew Voorhees and J. Jeremy Wisnewski, and one by Eduardo Mendieta. Voorhees and Wisnewski identify trends in the profession based to some extent on search-engine-based research. The topics they conclude have come to stay are human rights, cosmopolitanism, surveillance, diversity, democratic politics and cyber conflict. But they also express concern about the striking absence of political philosophy in public discourse, pointing out that in the United States -- the country on which they focus -- it is the novelist Ayn Rand who gets mentioned most commonly when politicians express their philosophical commitments. Neither philosophers nor philosophical reasoning make much of an appearance. Moreover, the future of any kind of philosophical discourse in political life is also threatened by funding cuts in the humanities as well as by the increasing presence of MOOCs, so the authors tell us, presumably because MOOCs replace actual engagement with teachers that would instigate philosophical reflection.

One thing to say in response to these sensible reflections is that philosophers must try harder to build or rebuild a presence in public life. The authors seem entirely right that especially political philosophy has become disconcertingly disconnected from public life, to such an extent that political philosophy's very own existence might eventually become threatened. It is heartening to see that Michael Sandel can be such a global success in his teaching of ideas about justice. There is no reason to think that what he can do others could not do as well. But indeed, philosophers must try harder actually to engage in this kind of activity.

At the same time, it is also possible that the striking absence of political philosophy from public life is not merely a symptom of the inaccessibility of philosophical discourse but also of the astounding indefensibility of many commonsense attitudes, most importantly the limited sense of responsibility for what happens in far-flung parts of the world or the distant future that many citizens and politicians of developed countries feel. Even political philosophies that by disciplinary standards count as moderate in their implications would require rather drastic changes from the standpoint of day-to-day politics. People do not want to be questioned in these attitudes.

Mendieta sees the key to the future of political philosophy in the liberation of global thought from the rather oppressive regime mainstream Western philosophy has imposed. Drawing on Enrique Dussel's Politics of Liberation, Mendieta points out that the history of thought has been a history of exclusion that has led to distorting prejudices: the history of philosophy is based on Hellenocentrism, Westernization, Eurocentrism, self-serving periodizations, secularism, intellectual colonialism and the myth of modernity. Details need not concern us (I hope the terms themselves convey enough information for present purposes) but the point is that each of these terms identifies a self-imposed limit on thought that needs to be superseded in order to reconnect to the true richness of intellectual life. Our current ecological crisis, Mendieta submits, "is itself a political effect of the world colonialism and imperialism built over the last 600 years" (p 218). He also insists that "Economic crises are the latest form of imperial pillage" (p 219).

But one must wonder about the radicalness of this approach. For one thing, interestingly, Mendieta mentions the sociologist Niklas Luhmann's term "world society" (p 219), by way of contrast with the parochial intellectual system that has emerged through all the acts of exclusion Mendieta and Dussel see at work in history. It is in the world society that more intellectual openness would now be required, and it has to come about, according to Mendieta, by dismantling established prejudice.

The term "world society" has indeed played some role in the work of Niklas Luhmann, but it has played a much larger role in the work of sociologist John Meyer, who has produced a substantial research paradigm around that idea. The defining feature of world society -- and it is in this fashion that world society analysis offers a unifying approach to global affairs -- is that it provides norms and roles that jostle up against each other. World polity theory helps itself to normative ideas because it finds that people act on them, instead of proposing explanations exclusively in terms of power, interests or economic structures. The theory is concerned with scripts whose acceptance, and the competition among which, create a world culture where certain norms, values and roles are broadly shared across countries and organizational contexts.

What world society theory tells us is that ideas and scripts win out not so much because oppressive measures make it so but because they find imitators. People adopt scripts because they want to emulate role models; they adopt values because they have seen others succeed who held them; and they endorse norms because they have seen such norms prevail. For the sake of illustration, consider the formation of states through decolonization. One way of thinking about this is that it is the ultimate irony that the political mode of organization of the colonial oppressors was accepted by the oppressed upon the withdrawal of the colonizers. But world society theory advises us otherwise. Decolonization generated many new states because that model of political organization was adopted by the people who declared their independence, and it was adopted because it had been successful. What used to be the model of the oppressors had been genuinely appropriated.

It is the same with many other ideas, values, scripts, and norms. What Mendieta and Dussel describe as a history shaped by acts of exclusion, world society theory describes as a history of successful adoption of such ideas, values, scripts and norms to the exclusion of others. What made them prevail was that people adopted them and made them their own. For instance, Greek philosophy is still around because it continues to speak to readers. But much as philosophers in Oxford or Boston can lay claim to the legacy of the Greeks as much as Greek intellectuals can, so can thinkers in Africa or South America. If all this is right the history of thought does not require as much liberation as Mendieta and Dussel think it does.

A second point to make is this. Consider Mendieta's conclusion. He asks us to overcome our self-imposed intellectual limitations, and he submits that should be done by giving pride of place to ideas such as human rights, self-determination of peoples, and more democracy. But all of these ideas have come to prominence in the world society precisely through the discourse Mendieta and Dussel characterize as a history of arbitrarily exclusionary acts. The reason why they have succeeded is because they have struck many people around the world as worth adopting, to the exclusion of many other ideas that have since fallen by the wayside or continue to be practiced even though nobody defends them theoretically. This is good news and bad news. The good news is that ideas of the right kind have already emerged in world society from the jostling-up of ideas, values and scripts against each other. The bad news is that they have such a hard catching on in a deep way and that philosophers seem to be doing such a bad job of helping with it.

Including these two pieces on the future of the field is a nice feature of this volume. All things considered, while I think this volume does not live up to what the publisher states as its goals, it does have a number of important virtues and is very much worth engaging with.