The Bloomsbury Companion to the Philosophy of Consciousness

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Dale Jacquette (ed.), The Bloomsbury Companion to the Philosophy of Consciousness, Bloomsbury, 2018, 504 pp., $176.00 (hbk), ISBN-13: 1474229012

Reviewed by Richard Brown, LaGuardia Community College, CUNY


This book is part of the Bloomsbury Companion series which Bloomsbury describes as, "a major series…aimed at postgraduate students, scholars and libraries. Each companion offers a comprehensive reference resource giving an overview of key topics, research areas, new directions and a manageable guide to beginning or developing research in the field. A distinctive feature of the series is that each companion provides practical guidance on advanced study and research in the field, including research methods and subject-specific resources."


This volume is edited by Dale Jacquette. I learned in the course of writing this review that he passed away in August of 2018. Jacquette had wide-ranging interests and did particularly important work on Schopenhauer and on early analytic philosophy.


The book has 18 essays, divided into five parts, as well an introduction. The first four parts contain essays, the fifth is a resources section and is the 'distinctive feature' of the book. The resources section contains an annotated bibliography, an annotated list of research resources, and an A-Z list of Key Terms and Concepts.


I was excited to read this book and I agree that the philosophy of consciousness may emerge as a distinctive subdiscipline of philosophy of mind and philosophy of psychology, as the introduction announces. I take philosophy of consciousness to be part of an interdisciplinary area sometimes called consciousness studies. Along with neuroscience (of consciousness, also on the verge of becoming a distinct subdiscipline of neuroscience), psychology, and A.I. consciousness studies addresses fundamental questions about conscious experience. However, I do not think that the goal of the Companion Series stated above is met in this volume.


Some of the dominant themes in the philosophy of consciousness include the (in)famous Hard Problem of consciousness and the two-dimensional argument against materialism from David Chalmers. The Hard Problem is that of explaining why any conscious experience at all should accompany the information processing of the brain.  Why isn't there no conscious experience? Or different ones? It seems as if any story we tell about the functioning of the brain is compatible with the absence of consciousness. It doesn't seem as if explaining any function or informational capacity of the brain will suffice to explain consciousness. And if not, the argument continues, consciousness cannot be physical. This has led to interesting developments in that panpsychism and idealism have seen revived interest. But also in that illusionism and eliminativism, the views that express skepticism in the very existence of consciousness as ordinarily thought of, have also been more seriously explored. Another dominant theme has been that of the debate between higher-order and first-order theories of consciousness. Higher-order theories claim that conscious experience requires a kind of inner awareness -an awareness of our own mental life. First-order theories deny that this is the case. There are many varieties of each kind of theory. Higher-order perception theories, higher-order thought theories, the Global Workspace Theory, The Attended Intermediate Representations (AIR) theory, The Integrated Information Theory (IIT), and Representationalism just to name a few. Debate continues about the best way to formulate these theories and also the best way to decide which may be on the right track. A third dominant theme has been that of the richness of conscious experience. The common-sense view is that our conscious experience is richly detailed, presenting to us all of detail in our visual field. Some have argued that this is undermined by phenomena like change blindness, where people fail to notice large changes in plain sight. Perhaps this suggests that our conscious experience is much sparser than we may have thought. Perhaps we only consciously experience some small amount of detail and the rest is somehow broad brushstrokes lacking a lot of detail. Another major set of issues is that of non-biological machines and whether they could be conscious in any sense like we are, or perhaps whether we could upload our conscious experiences into a machine.


Many of these issues are brought up and addressed by the contributors but few are systematically presented in a way that someone who was looking for a 'comprehensive resource' would require. The authors seemed to have interpreted the book's mandate in very different ways. Some offer their own theories, some an overview of some particular topic. In addition many make controversial claims and do not connect their discussion to other areas. In what follows I will briefly discuss each chapter.


The first part -Historical Development of Concepts of Consciousness- has four papers. It opens with Katherine Morris' "The Hard Problem of Understanding Descartes on Consciousness". Morris takes on Descartes' claim that consciousness (she uses the term 'conscientia') always involves an awareness of the conscious state itself. She rejects a higher-order account as well as a same-order account as an interpretation of what Descartes meant. She argues that, instead, we should interpret Descartes as arguing for a kind of implicit, background, awareness of our thoughts. When we engage in reflection this background awareness is made explicit. She also tries to connect this idea to the notion of conscience. She says in passing that something like this may be what the same-order theory of consciousness offered by Kriegel is after but she does nothing to connect her discussion with contemporary theories of consciousness.


In "Brentano's Aristotelian Concept of Consciousness", Liliana Albertazzi argues that Bentano's Aristotelian conception of consciousness offers an alternative to current views on consciousness and its science. In the third paper, "Wittgenstein and the Concept of Consciousness" Gary L. Hagberg presents Wittgenstein's argument against introspection and 'mental object' views and then argues that Wittgenstein is not a radical behaviorist. As someone who is not an expert on either Brentano or Wittgeinstein I could not asses these chapters.


The fourth paper 'Ordinary Consciousness' is by Julia Tanney. She argues that philosophers use a non-ordinary sense of consciousness when they argue against physicalism/functionalism. Her target is those, like David Chalmers, who take it that zombies are conceivable (this chapter is included in the book's historical development section, thereby, I guess, confining Chalmers to history?). I am no friend of zombies but even so I found this chapter unhelpful in the fight against zombies. When philosophers speak of 'what it is like' for them to taste chocolate, or smell a rose, they are definitely talking about ordinary consciousness. Tanney asks why we need to introduce zombies, or engage in other thought experiments (p. 82) rather than focusing on the ordinary notion of consciousness. The answer is that these thought experiments help to bring into focus what a theory of consciousness needs to explain as well as what would count as an explanation.


The crux of the problem for her seems to be that we allow that the zombie cannot be distinguished from a non-zombie via any third-person means and that this renders the notion problematical, since the very same criteria we use to attribute conscious experiences to normal persons will fail when we try to use it on the zombie (p 85). But when we conceive of a zombie we don't, as it were, imagine a world just like ours and then ask 'are these individuals conscious?' or 'how do I know that they aren't conscious?' We simply stipulate that the beings in question meet all third-person criteria for being conscious and yet aren't. The seeming coherence of that possibility (as evidenced by no one as of yet finding a logical contradiction that is implied by this way of describing zombies) is what fuels the Hard Problem of Consciousness. It should also be pointed out that though zombies get a lot of attention, the argument against physicalism (whether successful or not) does not depend on them. Any change in conscious experience with the same physical/functional set up does the trick. That issue aside, if this chapter is supposed to serve as an introduction to discussions about the metaphysics of consciousness then it does little in the way of giving an overview of the argument or the ensuing discussion.


The first paper in section two (Groundbreaking Concepts of Consciousness), is Keith Lehrer's "Consciousness, Representation and the Hard Problem". Lehrer addresses the hard problem of consciousness. First, he lays out his notion of exemplarization. This is a kind of self-representation involved in phenomenal consciousness. When one knows that one is having a conscious experience, on his view, one has the sensation taken into a thought and the sensation is an exemplar of the class or kind. So, when one has a pain, and then one comes to know that one is in pain, one uses the very pain one is in to stand as an exemplar of pains of that sort. This is different from his previous 'quotational' view which does not involve self-representation. When the pain is used as an exemplar it represents pains of that sort, but also itself since it is itself a pain of that sort. He distinguishes this kind of view from higher-order views (p. 98) since those views hold that phenomenal consciousness itself involves a kind of representation of the state. Lehrer denies that phenomenal consciousness itself requires this kind of self-representation and asserts (without much argument) that we can have conscious experience without representing it.


He tries to give three examples of conscious states that do not involve this kind of representation. The first is the example of touch. He says "the sensations of touch sometimes evoke representations of external things without higher-order representations or self-representations, "(p. 98). But this is not an argument so much as just a statement of his intuition about this case. These sensations may evoke experiences that do not seem to involve any kind of self-awareness but that is not an objection to the theory. So too for the other two examples. His second example is waking from sleep "experiencing some sensation without any conception or understanding of what is occurring to one," (p 98). This is laughably bad as a counter-example to the higher-order theory as those who take that route are usually at pains to argue that one can represent one's first-order states in more or less detail. So, if one wakes up and has a sensation and it is a conscious experience then the higher-order theory predicts that one will have a higher-order representation of that state but if one's conscious experience is not sharp one will represent the first-order state as some state or other and one will lack a conception or understanding of it. His final example is of a brain damaged patient with lesions to areas preventing higher-order representation but who has conscious pain experiences. This is asserted without any kind of actual neurological evidence that this can in fact happen. I understand he is more interested in discussing his own theory but this is very misleading for someone who doesn't know the area.


At any rate what does all of this have to do with the hard problem of consciousness? Lehrer says that the answer is that conscious states represent the world. However, there are two problems with this. First, this does not give us an answer to the hard problem all by itself since there are presumably representations in the brain that are not phenomenally conscious and if so we need an explanation of the difference between these two kinds of representation. None is given. Second, when we use a conscious state as an exemplar we know what it is like and by doing so we know what a representation of it is like. I found this truly confusing and do not see any way in which this addresses the hard problem. The hard problem is that of trying to explain how it is that brain states can be conscious experiences. Why is this particular brain state a state of consciousness as opposed to not? Lehrer has given us no traction on this problem. In fact he has begun his discussion by just assuming that sensations are conscious. At points he seems to think that the hard problem has to do with finding a function for consciousness but this is just a misunderstanding.


Next is Daniel Stoljar's "The Knowledge Argument and Two Interpretations of 'Knowing What it's Like'". Stoljar distinguishes between two senses of 'knowing what it is like' that he calls the interrogative and the free relative readings and he wants to examine these two readings as they interact with the knowledge argument against physicalism. His main aim is to examine -and ultimately reject- a response to the knowledge argument that he calls the knowing what-it's-like response (p. 109). On this response one claims that 'Mary knows what it is like to see red' is ambiguous between the two senses distinguished above and that neither of the resulting two new arguments are persuasive. Stoljar goes on to argue that this response ultimately fails because one can come up with versions of the Knowledge Argument that avoid the response. He then goes on to distinguish the knowing-what-it's-like response from the well-known responses to the argument by David Lewis and Michael Tye.


In "Conscious and Unconscious Mental" States," Richard Fumerton takes a purely armchair analysis of the question of whether there can be occurrant mental states of which we are unaware. He comes to the conclusion that he can't see why the dualist couldn't have unconscious pain -a feeling of pain without an awareness of feeling the pain- but despairs that there would be a way to empirically resolving the dispute. This very question has been the subject of a lot of discussion in relation to Ned Block's (2007) argument that we experience more than we can report. This was a missed opportunity to offer an introduction to this central area of research.


In the section's fourth paper, Rocco Gennaro gives us his interpretation of "Higher-Order Theories of Consciousness". Gennaro offers a survey of the traditional higher-order accounts but anyone new to the area reading this would get a very biased account. Specifically, there are three things that are misleading about Gennaro's overview.  The first is how he presents the theory. The second is how he responds to the classic misrepresentation objection to higher-order thought theories of consciousness. And the third is in presenting the case for whether or not the prefrontal cortex is a possible neural realizer of the relevant higher-order thoughts.  (Click for details of these points.)


Next is Scott Soames' "Kripke on Mind-Body Identity". Soames reconstructs Kripke's argument against mind-brain identity and then argues that it is inconclusive. As is well-known, Kripke's argument depends on mind-brain identities seeming to be contingent when they are really necessary, like all identities (if they are true). However, Kripke argues, we cannot explain away the appearance of contingency in the normal way for mind-brain identities. Soames argues that


the mistake of wrongly taking a proposition to be contingent that, in fact must be necessary if true, is due to the fact that establishing its truth requires empirical evidence ruling out scenarios where it is false. (p. 176)


Soames argues that this is true of both ordinary identity claims like that heat is molecular motion and mind-brain identities. This chapter gives a good introduction to Soames' version of Kripke's argument. However, there are other ways of construing Kripke's argument and those are not discussed. For example no use is made of Kripke's claim that the illusion of contingency is due to the fact that we can imagine someone in the same epistemic situation where an utterance related to the one we say is false. In addition it does not connect to the discussion of two-dimensional argument against materialism by David Chalmers, which has been somewhat more influential on the discussion of the metaphysics of consciousness. 


The third part - Metaphilosophy of Consciousness Studies- also has four papers. The first, "Understanding Consciousness by Building It," by Michael Graziano and Taylor W. Webb, advances the attention schema model of consciousness by pretending to be able to build a machine that has this property. Graziano and Webb first suggest the robot be equipped to have objective knowledge of the world (there is an apple; this captures first-order theories of consciousness), and then a cognitive access module is added (a model of global workspace theory). Then self-knowledge is added to the robot by adding a self-model (capturing higher-order theories). Finally, they add the attention schema, which is supposed to be a representation of the relationship between the representation of the apple and the self. In their way of putting it this is a description of attention, by the brain, that mis-describes it as a simple, magical essence. They try to distinguish their view from higher-order views. They claim this is because they could build a robot more like a rat than a person, with no linguistic ability and little higher-order cognitive capacities but this is a misunderstanding of higher-order theory. Higher-order theories do not rule out rat consciousness. Most embrace it. They clearly have some kind of higher-order theory (consciousness is an awareness of the relation between the representations of the self and the representations of the apple). Though they want the kind of awareness they invoke not to be higher-order thoughts but beyond calling it a 'model' and saying 'it describes the relationship between the representation of the apple and the representation of the self as follows…' they do not say what alternative to higher-order thought theory is. 


In "The Illusion of Conscious Thought", Peter Carruthers argues that thoughts are never access conscious. By this he means that we never have conscious thoughts which are causally efficacious in producing behavior or which figure in our reasoning processes. More exactly he argues that there are two plausible candidate theories for how conscious thoughts arise. One is the global workspace theory on which consciousness results from certain mental states being widely broadcast in the brain and accessed for use in reasoning and production of behavior. The other is higher-order theories, which, according to him, rely on a kind of direct awareness of our first-order mental states which is not like the way in which we become aware of other people's mental states (that is not by a kind of interpretation). On the global workspace theory there are no conscious thoughts according to him, because only sensory representations are globally broadcast and on the higher-order account there are no conscious thoughts because all of our knowledge of minds, our own included, is fundamentally interpretative and relies on the same processes that we use to interpret other people's minds. Thus, there are no first-order thoughts of which we become aware of in a fundamentally non-interpretative way.


He goes on to argue that the illusion arises because we experience ourselves as having conscious thoughts. That is, we may interpret our own inner speech or mental imagery in terms of wonderings, doubtings, judgings etc. For example, we may represent some mental imagery (say as of some stuff in a trunk) and our mental manipulation of it as our deciding to move a piece of luggage or as wondering how these various pieces will fit. What really happened, at the first-order level is that there was mental imagery and manipulation of it but we experience that as deciding or wondering. That is part of the reason why we think we have conscious wonderings and decidings, etc, when really we don't.


What is interesting is that this way of putting it seems to make Carruthers' view very close to the non-relational higher-order theory. In fact, Carruthers recognizes that in Rosenthal's account the relevant higher-order thought can be the result of inference as long as it does not seem to one that this is so (in a footnote). But Carruthers says that even on these theories there is not the kind of interpretation/mind-reading going on. It is not clear if this is accurate. Rosenthal has long argued that the relevant higher-order thoughts he postulates result in a kind of self-interpretation. Carruthers seems to be assuming that for me to have a conscious thought is for some first-order thought to acquire a property. But on Rosenthal's account a first-order thought's being conscious is a distinct property from its other first-order properties. It consists in having the relevant higher-order state.


Ted Honderich ("Actualism about Consciousness Affirmed")  talks about his Actualism about consciousness. He suggests that consciousness consists in the presence of a world, a subjective world distinct from the objective world. I found this difficult to follow and combined with the airy dismissals of many other theories of consciousness found the paper difficult to read. In the fourth paper, "Cracking the Hard Problem of Consciousness," Dale Jacquette defends the idea that "consciousness is the brain's unconscious (automatic) dynamic attribution of cognitive, including perceptual and affective data as properties to passing moments of objective mind-independent real time," (p. 261). It is hard to see how this will 'crack' the hard problem of consciousness and the discussion in the chapter does not help.


Part 4 -Mental Causation, Natural Law and Intentionality of Conscious States- has five papers. In "Towards Axiomatizing Consciousness", Selmer Bringsjord, Paul Bello, and Naveen Sundar Govindarajulu present an interesting attempt to formulate some axioms about access consciousness but terrible printing makes it impossible to see what the system actually looks like.


In "Intentionality and Consciousness" Carlo Ierna compares Searle and Huserrel on intentionality. Lerna argues that Husserl's notion of intentionality is superior to Searle's but the paper does not address the huge literature on intentionality that came after Searle's work on this topic. It is also strange that it is not in the book's historically oriented section.


In "Cognitive Approaches to Phenomenal Consciousness", Pete Mandik compares Daniel Dennett and David Rosenthal's theories of consciousness and then addresses one common empirically motivated argument against cognitive theories. Even here, in a generally good introduction to the issues, there is something controversial in the way the higher-order theory is presented. Mandik says


However, argues Rosenthal, another way in which we could be conscious of things is by thinking about them. In thinking about my cat even though I may not be currently perceiving the cat, I am nonetheless, in virtue of having that thought, thereby conscious of the cat (p 349).


This is a bit misleading since Rosenthal argues that one must think of the cat as present. Having thoughts about the cat does not make one conscious of the cat unless those thought represent the cat as being in the immediate vicinity. If the cat is right behind me and I think, 'watch out for the cat, it's right behind me' while not looking at the cat, then I am conscious of the cat. If I think 'the cat is really warm' I am not thereby conscious of the cat.


In "Free Will and Consciousness" Alfred Mele addresses the issues surrounding recent empirical claims to have debunked free will. In particular a lot has been made of some experiments originally done by Benjamin Libet where neural activity associated with making a decision comes before the subject reports that they made a decision. Many have taken this to indicate that an unconscious decision has been made by the time the subjects consciously decides to act. Mele carefully goes over these, and other, experiments and argues that they do not support this claim. Anyone who was not familiar with these issues would learn a lot from Mele's paper.


In the final paper, "Notes Towards a Metaphysics of Mind" Joseph Margolis reflects on Descartes, Kant, and Colin McGuin's argument for Mysterianism -the claim that we cannot understand how consciousness could be physical- and suggests that the mind must be "incarnate at every level of its being manifested at all," (p 393).


The annotated bibliography was quite extensive and gives a nice overview of important works related to the philosophy of consciousness. In addition, the resources section provides annotated lists of important journals, societies, research centers and institutions, encyclopedias and dictionaries (including online resources), bibliographies, as well as blogs and other websites, and an A-Z entry on Key terms and concepts related to consciousness.


While the resources section of the book seemed to clearly be aimed at meeting the goals of the Companion Series the papers, taken collectively, did not. Granted I have focused on what I know best, the metaphysics of consciousness and higher-order theories of consciousness, and someone who had a different approach may feel differently about these papers. But if you ask me, I would say we are lucky to have plenty of better options for those interested in the philosophy of consciousness.