The Boundary Stones of Thought: An Essay in the Philosophy of Logic

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Ian Rumfitt, The Boundary Stones of Thought: An Essay in the Philosophy of Logic, Oxford University Press, 2015, 345pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198733638.

Reviewed by John P. Burgess, Princeton University, and Jack Woods, Bilkent University


The core of Ian Rumfitt's new book, long in the making, is a suite of six chapters defending classical logic (mainly of negation, conjunction, and disjunction, with asides on conditionals but with quantification deferred) against five lines of criticism. These are preceded by a short introduction and two chapters expounding the distinctive conception of logic underlying the five case studies and followed by a conclusion concerned with the common theme of the five defenses, the separability of classical logic from the principle of bivalence. The work is a tribute to the continuing influence of the late Sir Michael Dummett, whose student Rumfitt was. Rumfitt repeatedly returns to Dummett's writings as his starting point, though he virtually never ends up accepting Dummett's conclusions. Dummettian influence is shown especially in the fact that, except for one chapter mainly on quantum logic, the rival to classical logic considered throughout is intuitionistic logic.

Classical and intuitionistic logics are indeed arguably the only logics in which (to adapt a memorable phrase of Solomon Feferman) anything like sustained ordinary reasoning can be carried on, as witnessed by the fact that professed adherents of other logics generally use one or the other of these, and not their preferred logics, in their metatheoretical work. (Rumfitt does argue that quantum logicians have an excuse for this procedure, which otherwise makes it look as if the deviant logicians only pretend to believe in their deviations.) Rumfitt himself is admirably careful in keeping track of which of his own metatheoretic discussions rely on distinctively classical principles and which should be intuitionistically acceptable. In fact, his use of intuitionistic logic in his metatheory demonstrates that there is common ground where intuitionists and classical logicians can dispute about which logic is correct without running into the well-known problems arising from interpreting intuitionistic logic classically. This is a nice result.

The book is dense; it includes digressions into side issues, invariably intriguing if not always compelling, of which no note can be taken in a short review. No book of reasonable size on an important subject can go into all relevant background material, and the main background missing here is any discussion of what is meant by semantics. The term, though of frequent appearance in the text, is not even listed in the index. It was coined in the late nineteenth century as the label for a linguistic theory of meanings but, curiously, came in the mid-twentieth century to be used for a mathematical theory of models and is now used in both conflicting senses, often without clearly distinguishing the two. Rumfitt's understanding of the term, which has to be guessed from his usage, evidently takes semantics to have to do with meaning, or with sense (which he defines as the logically relevant part of content, content itself being undefined), though he does not show the linguist's characteristic concern with issues of psychological reality and allows himself considerable apparatus of a kind hard to imagine being directly represented in the mind or brain. Classical semantics Rumfitt does define as consisting of the principles that every statement is either true or false (bivalence) and none both, plus the truth-principles for the individual particles (if A is true, not-A is false; if A is false, not-A is true; and so on).

The second and third chapters present Rumfitt's conception of logic (heavily influenced by Dana Scott). In mathematics the ideal is often advocated that every step of argumentation should follow logically from steps previously admitted and ultimately from postulates acknowledged in advance even though it has perhaps only recently become feasible to realize this ideal with aid from automated proof assistants. Rumfitt, by contrast, thinks that there is a genuine notion of mathematical deducibility in which the arguments actually given by mathematicians can be considered genuine deductions, not enthymemes with suppressed premises. Or rather, there are supposed to be various notions of algebraic, geometric, and other kinds of mathematical deducibility, and nonmathematical deducibility relations as well. Logic, on Rumfitt's conception, is concerned with general laws common to all deducibility relations (reflexivity, monotonicity, and a generalized form of transitivity) as well as laws for particular logical particles articulating how deductions involving them can be spliced together (an example being the introduction rule for disjunction: if C is deducible in whatever sense from A and deducible in the same sense from B, then it is deducible from A-or-B). Every deducibility relation can be understood in terms of a corresponding notion of possibilities (for the cognoscenti, related to it by the Lindenbaum-Scott theorem). Out of all this emerges a conception of logical deducibility and logical possibilities as the extreme case.

The alternatives to classical semantics that Rumfitt considers all build on a notion of truth at a possibility. Possibilities, like what are elsewhere called situations, are not assumed maximally specific or determinate, unlike worlds. The crucial structural relation among possibilities is the relation x ≤ y, assumed to be a partial order, of y being a further specification or determination of x, meaning that anything true at x is true at y. The main task undertaken in elaborating a semantics is to provide definitions of the collection |A| of possibilities at which a statement A is true such that |not-A| and |A and B| and |A or B| are specifiable in terms of |A|, |B|, and the relation ≤. The definitions listed in different forms at several places (compare p.119 and p.229, correcting the obvious misprint in the disjunction case in the latter) will not, when the different notations are unpacked, much surprise the reader familiar with various kinds of formal models elaborated in the literature in other contexts. Except in one regard: The definition of ≤ as given quantifies over all statements, while |not-A|, for instance, is defined as the set of possibilities which are individually incompatible with every member of |A|, and incompatibility is defined in terms of ≤; the extension of |not-A| thus may depend on the distribution of truth and falsity to various molecular sentences, including not-A itself, over the space of possibilities. Such potential circularity or impredicativity might seem worrisome. Could it be avoided, perhaps by replacing ≤ with its restriction to atomic statements in the definition of incompatibility and deriving the current definition of ≤ as a lemma? Putting this aside, the most interesting point is that which logic is validated depends not only on these definitions and the structural assumptions about ≤ but also on which subcollections of the collection of all possibilities are taken to be available to serve as |A| for a statement A. In particular, if we have a set-up that validates intuitionistic logic, requiring |A|=|not-B|, for some B, immediately implies by double application that |A|=|not-not-C| for some C, from which it is a short step, reproducing the reasoning of the double-negation interpretation of classical in intuitionistic logic, to the conclusion that classical logic is validated.

There is only space to take brief note of the specifics of the five case studies, each of which can be expected to generate considerable discussion. Chapter 4 concerns an argument in Dummett's early paper "Truth", a flimsy thing, which Dummett was not long in abandoning and which Rumfitt is not long in demolishing but which serves as a peg on which to hang an interesting discussion of an exclusionary view of content (a statement is understood by understanding which possibilities it rules out, not which possibilities it rules in). Chapters 5 and 6 take off from the famous Dummettian verificationist attack on the use of classical logic, in the first instance in mathematics. To some of us it has long been apparent that this could not generalize to a case for intuitionistic logic across the board since in connection with empirical matters one would have to take into account (1) that "verification" in general at most establishes defeasible presumption and (2) performing the operations needed to "verify" one statement might preclude performing those needed for another, so that features of (1) nonmonotonic and (2) quantum logic could be expected to be required. Rumfitt especially presses the complaint that no strong case has been made for replacing necessary truth-preservation by warrant-preservation as the criterion of deductive validity. The discussion leads into chapter 6, which takes up quantum logic and so perhaps inevitably becomes the most technical. In particular, a structural requirement on ≤ that is highly technical, but said to reflect the monotonicity of deducibility, is introduced and invoked in connection with distributivity, the main area of classical-quantum conflict. It might have been interesting if Rumfitt had related his approach here to the well-known work of C. H. Randall and D. J. Foulis, which purports to derive something formally like quantum logic from verificationist principles without bringing in microphysics specifically.

Chapter 7 turns to a third complaint, the traditional intuitionist claim that the mathematical infinite requires a different logic from the classical. It is here that the matters pertaining to the double negation interpretation alluded to above are brought in and connected with the exclusionary conception from an earlier chapter. Chapter 8 concerns a fourth complaint, concerning vagueness, specifically of the chromatic kind, starting from Crispin Wright's suggestion that intuitionistic logic may help with the sorites paradox. Rumfitt thinks it doesn't and offers instead a classical solution based on his distinctive semantics, heavily stressing that it allows "A-1 or A-2 or . . . or A-100" to be true without any "A-n" being true. Chapter 9 takes very seriously William Tait's version of the frequently-made suggestion that quantification over arbitrary sets must be considered to be governed by intuitionistic and not classical logic, in which that conclusion is presented as somehow following from the fact that no complete axiomatization of set theory is available.

Rumfitt, after examining all sorts of technical results and philosophical commentary thereupon, doesn't ultimately defend the combination of classical logic and classical set theory. This is not surprising since he doesn't question the most contentious presupposition of the kind of skepticism he is examining. He wants simultaneously to accept as a premise (p.265) that mathematics does not describe a realm of reality wholly independent of human thought while denying that this view implies that the number two did not exist before there were thinkers of capable of doing elementary arithmetic (p.264). This is sustainable if one takes it that the part of the mathematical realm to which the number two belongs is wholly independent of human thought while some other parts are not, including, presumably, the part containing large cardinals, say. But this combination of views still leaves one committed to saying that the existence of large cardinals, at least, is partly dependent on human thought, in which case they couldn't have existed before there were human thinkers. And so it leaves one still committed to saying that it makes sense in some cases to speak of mathematical objects as existing at one time and not at another. If one takes it that what is dependent on human thought, and wholly so, is set theory, but that the rules human thought establishes for set theory, for speaking within the theory of sets rather than speaking of set theory from outside, preclude significant application of tense distinctions to set-existence statements, then the whole skeptical line of thought will appear a muddle, a confusion of two levels of language, of a kind Rudolf Carnap exposed long ago.

Rumfitt's concessive stance on classical set theory also suggests an overarching question about his defense of classical logic. Since logical possibility is supposed to be the limiting case of possibility, and since in several of the cases considered, adding an additional, if plausible, constraint can be shown (intuitionistically) to vindicate classical logic, what rules out holding that the broadest notion of logical consequence, and hence logical possibilities, is intuitionistic but that in a great many cases we are well justified in focusing on a subset of the logical possibilities -- those obeying, |A|=|not-B|, for some B, say -- which vindicates classical logic? Such a dish strikes us as unpalatable, but it would be desirable to have a more principled reason for taking it off the menu. But rather than take the foregoing comments as criticism, let them be taken as an indication of how much Rumfitt leaves us to discuss and how provocative his own discussions can be.