The Brain and the Meaning of Life

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Paul Thagard, The Brain and the Meaning of Life, Princeton UP, 2010, 274 pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691142722.

Reviewed by Adina Roskies, Dartmouth College



As the title suggests, Paul Thagard has undertaken an ambitious project in The Brain and the Meaning of Life. After all, in over 2500 years of philosophizing, we have reached no single widely-accepted answer to the meaning of life and, in the course of modern neuroscience, still very little understanding of the brain. Thagard’s goal is to use the insights from the brain sciences to inform the age-old search for an answer to the great existential question. What he comes up with is far more prosaic than what one might hope, even while acknowledging our current impoverished understanding of the brain.

To cut short your anticipation, Thagard does indeed offer an answer to the meaning of life question, and it is this: “Love, work, and play.” Less telegraphically, the basic claim is that the meaning of life is to be found in the proper balance of relationships, satisfying accomplishment, and enjoyment. As Fodor would say, Granny could have told me as much. We don’t need brain science to tell us that, nor does the brain science really justify the conclusion. Moreover, Thagard’s answer doesn’t provide much guidance for how to live life; it offers no recipe to decide how to best find meaning in those areas, how to balance the conflicting demands that pursuit of all the above often entails, or what proper balance is in the first place. Disappointingly, my life prospects are no better, nor my deep questions less pressing, having read this book.

Love, work and play. Thagard reaches this humdrum answer (which may, incidentally, nonetheless be correct) after rehearsing a series of arguments about what we can know and what we should believe based on a monistic, naturalistic perspective that Thagard calls “neural naturalism.” Thagard lays the groundwork for an evidence-based naturalistic approach, uses this to argue that mind is brain, and then that the brain enables us to know reality. In the course of these arguments he sweeps aside transcendental and antirealist arguments in a mere few paragraphs, denies that there are any a priori or necessary truths, and champions a common-sense empiricism over rationalism. Even where my sympathies coincide with Thagard’s views, his argumentation makes me bristle. Thagard fails to indicate to the naïve reader either the depth of the philosophical questions about which he takes sides, or the ingenious and often insightful arguments that have been offered for alternative views throughout the history of philosophy. This is emblematic of the book as a whole: it fails to provide an appreciation of the complexity of the questions or the subtlety of philosophical arguments, and lines of serious philosophical argumentation are dismissed in a cursory way which is vaguely insulting to the reader. If I were a layperson reading this book (and it is geared for the lay audience) this simplistic rendition of these debates would paint a dismal picture of philosophy as a worthwhile pursuit, and of the people who pursue it. Even though some simplification is warranted when writing for a lay audience, the way the debates are simplified here does the reader, and the questions, a disservice. The arguments often seem convincing only because the objections haven’t been given a fair hearing.

There is an extended argument throughout the book that endeavors to derive value from neural mechanisms of valuation. The core of the book lies in the discussion of the emotional system as the brain’s basis for representing value, and extrapolation from that to more philosophical claims about value in life. In chapter 5 Thagard gives an introduction to the emotional systems in the brain, relating how neural firing in regions such as the nucleus accumbens and the amygdala are correlated with positive and negative feelings, respectively. He reviews two major competing theories for brain processing of emotion, cognitive appraisal and bodily perception, and concludes that both are correct. He writes, “In an attempt to explain emotional consciousness, I developed the EMOCON model … which depicts relations among many of the most important brain areas.” There is an accompanying diagram showing connectivity among a number of brain regions including the dopaminergic system and amygdala, some prefrontal brain areas, external stimuli and bodily states. In the diagram, the brain regions are bounded by a dotted line, labeled “emotional feeling.” And this is how emotion is “explained.” This too is typical of the book and illustrative of the reason it is maddening. The model fails to explain what Thagard sets out to explain: emotional consciousness. The legend says: “The dotted line is intended to indicate that emotional consciousness emerges from activity in the whole system.” The model merely stipulates, but does not explain the difficult part of emotional consciousness — why emotions, or the neural activity that presumably causes or constitutes them, feel like anything at all. Later in the text Thagard says,

the positive and negative character of emotional experience has been explained by the role of particular brain areas such as the nucleus accumbens and amygdala, well known to be associated with feeling good or bad. The reason it feels good to be happy is neural, related to activity in particular brain regions associated with both bodily perceptions and cognitive appraisals … Because the EMOCON model can explain all these characteristics of emotional experience, it becomes plausible to identify emotional feelings with brain states. (pp. 106-7)

I don’t think it takes a professional philosopher to recognize that this assertion is not an explanation. Throughout the book, Thagard slides over the hard issues by claiming to have solved them, ignoring the difficulties, or passing them off as minor issues that will be resolved with a little more data.

In chapter 6 Thagard tackles decision making. Neuroscientific research has amassed a large body of data regarding the mechanisms of decision-making at the neural level, and we have a detailed physiological and mathematical understanding of their workings. Thagard omits a discussion of this data, opting instead to characterize decision-making impressionistically. Decisions are inferences to the best plan of action based on goals set by emotional valuation; the inferences are the result of achieving coherence among brain areas via parallel constraint satisfaction. The best plan is apparently some coherence between goals and actions, but when complete coherence is impossible, what gives? Although Thagard touches on goal revaluation and revision, he provides no criteria for what it means to make an inference to the best plan, since there are different ways to achieve coherence. Incidentally, his view precludes free will, which he blithely dismisses as an illusion. Skipping over a vibrant and controversial contemporary philosophical debate, he assures the reader that lack of free will is of no great consequence.

Chapter 7 presents his argument that the meaning of life is love, work and play. His strategy is to identify objectively valuable goals that can be satisfied with love, work and play by appealing to brain data. If love, work and play are the best practices for satisfying the vital needs of human beings, then, he claims, the practices are normatively justified as sources of objective meaning. To me, this argument suggests instead that love, work and play would have instrumental value in fulfilling the needs, not intrinsic value as Thagard claims. Moreover, his argument really rests not on brain data but on the psychological work of Deci and Ryan, who identify psychological needs for competence, autonomy and relatedness. Thagard argues, reasonably, that love, work and play can satisfy these needs, and thus contribute to human well-being. This seems fine, but it raises a number of questions, some of which are addressed, but none satisfactorily. Why these three? Why not other things that also satisfy basic human needs? Why not say that the satisfaction of those needs, whatever form such satisfaction takes, provides meaning to life, or that the meaning of life is human well-being?

Thagard attempts to give a brain-based explanation for why such needs exist, but it isn’t clear what in his argument requires a resort to the neural level: since the needs are psychologically defined, what import does the neural level have? Recognizing these questions, Thagard responds that the neural basis demonstrates that the psychological needs are biological. But that follows from any physicalist view, and it does not justify his claim. If all psychological phenomena are biologically instantiated, then being biological does not privilege one over another, nor is one more objectively real than another. Moreover, the move to biology seems to threaten Thagard’s favored view. Since the reward system is implicated in both satisfaction of needs and nonessential desires, pointing to its importance threatens to undermine his argument based on needs. Thagard’s view is predicated on the objective validity of a multiplicity of goals. But satisfaction of goals of many sorts leads to activation of the reward system, so perhaps this is what best unites them. If so, it is not clear how Thagard can ultimately resist concluding that the activation of the reward system is itself objectively valuable. And this leaves him open to a position he does not want to endorse: that the most meaningful life can be achieved by maximal activation of the reward system. That would put meaning in the hands of Woody Allen’s orgasmatron, certainly not the conclusion Thagard favors.

In chapter 9 Thagard attacks another deep normative question, the nature of ethics. He wants to argue that ethical questions too can be answered by looking at the neural basis for ethical behavior. There is a lot of fascinating new work in psychology and neuroscience regarding the neurological bases of social interaction, but it behooves us to approach it with a critical eye. Thagard does not. He appeals to mirror neurons to explain altruism and empathy, despite the fact that we lack compelling evidence for mirror neurons in humans or for their importance to prosocial behavior. Mere overlap in brain regions activated in a task is not evidence for cellular mirroring properties. While the existence of mirror neurons may make plausible just-so stories about social cognition, much more careful argumentation and new evidence is necessary for explanations of moral behavior hinging on mirroring to rise to the standards of evidence that Thagard himself champions.

Thagard’s take on ethics is difficult to pin down. At points he seems to suggest that empathy is necessary for moral motivation (p. 193), at others that it is neither necessary nor sufficient (p. 194). He wisely acknowledges that brain data is insufficient to direct us to a particular ethical theory, but he does think, along with others, such as Greene and Cohen, that it pushes us toward a version of consequentialism. Although he claims this move is based on recognition of vital human needs, I suspect it has more to do with his rejection of free will. Despite his protestations to the contrary, Thagard slips from is to ought, deriving claims about how people should act on the basis of how their brains happen to work. I remain unclear why Thagard is led to consequentialism: one can just as easily imagine a version of deontology consistent with his view of needs. Indeed, Thagard’s own version of consequentialism seems to incorporate elements of relativism and deontology (i.e., it is “pluralistic” and “compatible with rights” (pp. 198-200). Finally, Thagard argues that moral objectivity can be preserved if we look to biology.

Needs-based consequentialism fits well with the brain-based emotional consciousness account of moral intuition and with the cultural diversity of moral behavior. The difficulty of arriving at indisputable moral principles is the result not of moral relativity, but rather of the huge complexity of determining the range and importance of human psychological needs and calculating the consequences of the available range of actions. (p. 203)

The suggestion is, I take it, that moral disagreement is just the result of our ignorance; if we understood the brain better, we would understand needs better and could reach agreement on moral questions. I am not convinced.

The Brain and the Meaning of Life rubbed me in all the wrong ways. Thagard dresses up old ideas in new biological clothing, and seems to pick and choose elements of opposing positions that are attractive, without really dealing with the subtle difficulties that arise in trying to come up with principled intermediate positions. It is often uncritical and sloppy. To be fair to Thagard, I am not his ideal audience. I already believe many of the things the book argues for, and so perhaps I am not impressed by his point of view. Though unadvertised, I think the book is really aimed at people who seek their answers in the divine rather than the natural, who believe on faith rather than on evidence. Thagard sets out his epistemic standards early in the book, modeling them on evidence-based medicine, in order to address this demographic. However, the arguments in the book are so thin, and the logic often so muddled, that I would be surprised if any of the believers who might pick up this book would abandon their faith for neural naturalism. Despite his endorsement of empiricist views, the book reads like an argument from authority, with “Trust me, I’m a doctor” being the underlying subtext. People should shop as wisely for their philosophical health as for their bodily well-being.