The British Aesthetic Tradition: From Shaftesbury to Wittgenstein

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Timothy M. Costelloe, The British Aesthetic Tradition: From Shaftesbury to Wittgenstein, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 350pp., $34.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521734486.

Reviewed by Christopher Williams, University of Nevada, Reno


If we distinguish the history of aesthetic theory from an aesthetic tradition (on the assumption that a tradition necessarily involves at least a bit of history), in what does the distinction consist? Timothy Costelloe, in his introduction to this impressively learned book, does not explicitly address this question, but he does characterize his project as an account of a certain aesthetic tradition -- the British -- rather than (merely?) as a history. In explaining, and justifying, his choice of title, he mentions the element of continuity in a tradition (5), and his statement may suggest that he believes that the figures he discusses provide the materials for something like a continuous conversation, one that is dominated by but not, as he hastens to tell us, confined to British natives. (Dewey, Santayana, and other non-Britons, count as belonging to the tradition.) Although Costelloe's introduction focuses on clarifying the sense in which the examined tradition is legitimately but not nationally British and not in examining the meaning of tradition as such, a conception of tradition, or continuity, in broadly conversational terms would not, I think, do justice to the actual achievement of the book. That conception would in fact mildly misrepresent it.

Comprising three main divisions that correspond to each of the last three centuries, more or less -- the "Age of Taste," the "Age of Romanticism," and the "Age of Analysis" -- Costelloe's book begins with Shaftesbury, and concludes with vignettes of several post-Wittgensteinian aestheticians (Frank Sibley, Kendall Walton, Maurice Mandelbaum, Arthur Danto, George Dickie). Many figures lie between these bookends, and the basic organization of the book is supplied by individual thinkers. As for the topics that these thinkers deal with, we start with the standard of taste, the beautiful and the sublime, and the paradox of tragedy, proceed to encounters with the picturesque, genius, and ideas about the moral significance of art, and finish with professional philosophical treatments of the definition of art. A continuous conversation, arguing about an evolving set of the same questions, is not really what this narrative delivers. But it does deliver something else.

An aesthetic tradition cannot be mainly the handiwork of philosophers who are specially interested in general aesthetic theories or who want to make connections between results in other areas of philosophy (such as the philosophy of mind) and aesthetics. It is also, and perhaps even preeminently, the product of people who care deeply about our experience of the arts, or of natural beauty (or sublimity, or whatever quality it is for which the perception of non-human environments are thought to be prized). These persons are rarely philosophers of distinction, though they may write prolifically about their concerns, and what they write is, or should be, relevant to the philosopher who turns aesthetician. Once this point is made explicit, it may indeed seem almost a truism, but it needs to be kept in view when we think about the diverse cultural moments, over several centuries, in which paintings or poems are made, argued about, and thought worth arguing about (or not). One of the great merits of Costelloe's book is its persistent attention to writers whom aestheticians nowadays are less likely to read precisely because they are not philosophers. In addition to the usual suspects from the acknowledged philosophical tribe (Hume, Burke) as well as the less usual (Alexander Gerard, Archibald Alison), we find ample sections on artists and critics such as Hogarth, Reynolds, Wordsworth and Coleridge, Hazlitt, Ruskin, Pater, Fry, and Bell. These are persons whom aestheticians ignore outright, or (in the case of the unfortunate Bell, whose "Aesthetic Hypothesis" made him an anthology-ready author) use for undergraduate target practice. Helpfully reconstructing their outlook and illuminating their historical context, sometimes simply by reading a text in its entirety, Costelloe treats them with the sympathy they deserve and the patience they often require.

Costelloe has an especially fascinating chapter (to my mind) on the picturesque, an aesthetic category that briefly enjoyed a vogue with the chattering classes in the decades just before and after 1800. An able cicerone, he shows us how the concept was articulated -- occasionally through their mutual antagonism -- by William Gilpin, Uvedale Price, Richard Payne Knight, and Humphry Repton (the last named being a landscape gardener who coined the enduring term 'landscape gardening'). For readers seeking to understand the etiology of the picturesque, and the reasons for its seemingly short-lived bid to join the ranks of the beautiful and the sublime as a distinct aesthetic quality, this chapter furnishes valuable hints. It also helps us to appreciate points of contact that might otherwise remain elusive between the taste-mindedness of the eighteenth century and the preoccupations of romanticism.

A book of this sort aims to cover a fair amount of territory, and the author's erudition makes the effort at coverage a success. However, the book does not try to be a one-volume encyclopedia that conveniently assembles well-established, if esoteric, facts. The British aesthetic tradition, like other traditions, is subject to change, growth, decline; and Costelloe's serial exposition of his thinkers can be regarded as attempting to make the case for a certain vision of what that tradition involves. The construction of such an argument is not the province of an encyclopedia, at least not a modern one. Costelloe's sections frequently contain remarks that a reference work might also contain, but not all of the remarks would be at home there. So, for instance, when Costelloe says, in a passage explaining how R. G. Collingwood has a foot in the ages of both romanticism and analysis, that the "philosophical focus on language and analysis" was "destined to become the official and often-featureless face of Anglo-American philosophy" (274), his statement has an import -- and not necessarily polemical -- for a story he is telling about a tradition.

Now the reason why the genre of the book, so to speak, is worth highlighting is that specialists might well cavil at details in the thinkers' portraits. But I think that criticisms at this level would be largely misdirected. Because Costelloe has three centuries to get through, the sections will perforce be fairly modest in length, and particular claims are apt to be tendentious, if nothing else, in tone or substance. This is not a fault of the genre. Yet if those sections dispose the reader to look at Repton for the first time, or even to look at Bell with fresh eyes a second time, this book will have done yeoman's service for which a reader has strong reason to be grateful.

If I have a larger concern about the book, it would be that the intended shape of the overall narrative is less than clear, that Costelloe is more content to be a chronicler than he should be. T,he final pages, which present Dickie's institutional theory of art make for a downbeat coda to the earlier chapters. On Dickie's theory, Costelloe notes that whether an object is a work of art is "quite independent . . . of whether the object is 'good' or 'bad'" and that its being a work of art is "a status obtained from being placed in art galleries, reviewed in art magazines, sold for large sums of money, and so on" (322). We have evidently come a long way from the exalted view of aesthetic appreciation found in Shaftesbury, Wordsworth, or Ruskin, and have come much closer to the trivial pursuits that Collingwood caustically dismissed as amusement for the overfed rich. That the ending is downbeat, though, is not the crucial issue. It is rather that the ending, in the light of what has gone before, seems arbitrary.

It might be protested that the problem with the conclusion of the story is simply the recent obsessions of aestheticians, not Costelloe's recounting of them. There would be some propriety in our saying this. Costelloe himself seems uneasy about the state of the tradition, for here is the very last thing he says:

One is left with the nagging thought that, as the eighteenth-century founders of aesthetics urged, there might really be something about certain objects that affects us in unusual and unique ways, and for want of better terms, we might call that "beauty" "sublimity," or "the picturesque." (323)

Possibly so: that thought, at any rate, nags at me as well. But if such a suspicion about our legacy is sound, one might wonder why more was not done earlier in the narrative to vindicate the claim to centrality that the qualities that move people "in unusual and unique ways" possess. Costelloe pays a good deal of attention to the beautiful, the sublime, and the picturesque wherever they put in an appearance among his chosen thinkers, but their appearance sometimes seems to portend a limited relevance to the subsequent account of the conversation. As regards the picturesque, for instance, Costelloe writes that Ruskin's bleak reflections on life in a mountain village represent the "grand finale" of serious engagement with the picturesque, that "history has shown it to be profoundly of its time and place," and that it now survives only in holiday brochures and postcards (241). But given the last sentence of the book, can this assessment be quite right? And if it is, should it not be lamented?

Or to grasp the other end of the stick: in opening with Shaftesbury, Costelloe stresses the neo-Platonic element in his thought, and makes a few references to similar elements in the thought of later writers. Unless I am mistaken, the last such reference occurs in connection with Bell, who is "drawn by the metaphysical promises of neo-Platonism, though in his hands it sounds tired and worn" (272). Since the neo-Platonism of Shaftesbury originally had to do with the revelation of mind -- a divine one -- in the world, it could be said that the concept of expression, as deployed in the tradition, is the carrier of Shaftesbury's seminal idea, inasmuch as the mind that art (or nature, or art that evokes nature) reveals need not be divine, but must be someone's, perhaps ours. Although it is a fine gesture on Costelloe's part to include discussion of Bell in a chapter titled "Theories of Expression" (as the formalism of Bell and Fry is often uncritically assumed to be an alternative to the so-called expression theory of art), Costelloe's focus on expression is largely confined to this chapter. Even though Costelloe does note that Reid has been thought to offer "the beginning of an 'expressivist' theory of art" (31 n.23), that hint might have been pursued with more vigor, or at least more visibility, if expression is one of the keys to the British version of the tradition that Shaftesbury inaugurated.

These queries suggest that the different chapters of the book do a more fully realized job of chronicling assorted anglophone interests that can be collected together under the rubric of the aesthetic than of limning an anglophone aesthetic tradition. But the queries also suggest that the second job may be doable. Concerning tradition, the very idea, Collingwood wrote: "The continuity of tradition is the continuity of the force by which past experiences affect the future; and this force does not depend on the conscious memory of those experiences."1 In these remarks of mine, I have tried to indicate, no more than roughly, the kind of additions or emphases that could serve to show how past reflection on aesthetic experience might color future reflection, and so constitute an identifiable and indisputable tradition. This book provokes us to persevere with that task and contributes much to our recognition of its importance.

1 Roman Britain and the English Settlements (Oxford: Clarendon, 1936), 252.