The British Moralists on Human Nature and the Birth of Secular Ethics

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Michael B. Gill, The British Moralists on Human Nature and the Birth of Secular Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 359pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780852463.

Reviewed by Elizabeth S. Radcliffe, Santa Clara University


British moral philosophy in the Early Modern period involves a remarkable evolution of important themes, several of which have inspired studies by contemporary philosophers. In his 1995 book, Stephen Darwall traced in the philosophies of the prominent British Moralists the development of the notion that motivation is essentially connected to judgments of obligation.[1] In 1998, J.B. Schneewind offered an interpretation of how the notion of morality as self-governance was developed in Kant as a response to the moral philosophy of the preceding two centuries.[2] Michael Gill's excellent book now takes up a third theme in seventeenth- and eighteenth-century thought, namely, the answer to the question whether human nature is inherently good or inherently evil, and uses the respective philosophers' replies to that question to illuminate in part how and why their moral theories developed in the way they did. The other part of the explanation has to do with their views on the relation of God to morality and the opposition between two ideas: that morality is founded on the will of God, and so not subject to reason (moral voluntarism); and the view that morality is founded in features discoverable by human and divine faculties, prior to any of God's commands (moral intellectualism).

Gill's book has a narrower focus than the other two mentioned. As he explains in his introduction, his analysis is not intended to constitute "a comprehensive map" of the whole territory of early modern moral thought, but is instead meant to follow in detail a thread through four main systems of thought, that of the Cambridge Platonists (Whichcote and Cudworth), Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, and Hume. Gill also finds in "the Human Nature Question" an interpretative key to understanding other shifting perspectives in early modern philosophy, including the swing from moral rationalism to moral sentimentalism, and from religious dogmatism to the advocacy of religious liberty. The book is divided into four parts of several chapters each, and each part concerns one of the systems of thought named above. The first three parts open with some interesting and philosophically relevant historical and biographical information that reveals the influences of one philosopher or school on another, and contributes substantially to our understanding of the development of non-theistic ethics in these centuries.

In Part One, we learn of Benjamin Whichcote's and Ralph Cudworth's Calvinist upbringing and indoctrination into the views of William Perkins in the 1600s and their eventual departures from Calvinism's negative answer to the Human Nature Question. The Cambridge Platonists' movement began with Whichcote at Emmanuel College, Cambridge, who claimed to be inspired by Plato and by the character of the historical Socrates.  He rejected the idea that people should use critical self-examination to expose their own sinfulness and replaced it with the notion that human beings are fundamentally good. One of Gill's insights in this discussion is that out of this "Whichcotean" idea grew the theme common in modern moral philosophy of the importance of "being able to bear one's own survey," to live contentedly with one's own character. Cudworth joined Whichcote in his rejection of the Calvinist doctrines of the depravity of human nature, of voluntarism, of predestination, and of supralapsarianism (the view that who was damned and who was saved was determined in advance by God). Whichcote and Cudworth held a meta-theology by which morality informed their view of God, not vice versa. Thus, God could not arbitrarily determine the content of morality, and a moral God would not condemn people before they were even born. Gill identifies in Whichcote and Cudworth the "ought-implies-can" objection: One can only be expected to do what one is able to do, and to condemn people before they were born would be to punish them for actions outside their control.  Furthermore, because Whichcote and Cudworth attributed importance to one's reflective view of one's own character, they portrayed salvation as moral rectitude, indicated by the fulfilled state of mind we possess when we do as we ought.

Gill aptly describes the obvious struggle the Cambridge Platonists faced in reconciling standard Protestant religious doctrine with their ethical views. Most pointedly, the doctrine of salvation through grace and acceptance of Christ was undermined by their characterization of salvation as a state we achieve on own by the inward principles we adopt. The upshot of Gill's account is to illustrate the contributions Whichcote and Cudworth unwittingly made to the separation of ethics from religion.

In Part Two, Gill elucidates the influence of Cambridge Platonism on Shaftesbury and how Shaftesbury's own adoption of a positive answer to the Human Nature Question was crucial to the content of his philosophical views. The personal connection between Shaftesbury and Cudworth was through Cudworth's daughter, Damaris, who was interested in philosophy and became close friends of John Locke, tutor to Anthony Ashley Cooper, the Third Earl of Shaftesbury ("Shaftesbury"). Gill explains that Shaftesbury would have been exposed to the doctrines of the Cambridge Platonists in other ways, however. In 1698, Shaftesbury wrote a preface to a volume of Whichcote's sermons, arguing that propagation of the doctrine that humanity is inherently evil was a self-fulfilling prophecy and that human beings do possess virtuous principles that can move them. Shaftesbury's detailed views are difficult to decipher, both because his ideas are presented largely through characters he adopts in a dramatic narrative and because his ideas are in flux, and Gill spends the four chapters of this part interpreting them. He does an expert job at this, identifying two persistent notions in Shaftesbury's thought throughout: that moral virtue is not established by fiat and that humans can care about virtue in itself (thus, the egoistic view of human nature from Hobbes is mistaken).

Shaftesbury has been regarded in contemporary discussions as the first early modern moral sense theorist, but Gill shows how that description requires qualification. In his Inquiry concerning Virtue, or Merit, moral character is a matter of motives. A sensible being is good if its affections promote the well-being of the system of which it is a part, and it is virtuous if in reflecting on its own passions, it has a positive attitude toward them. This capacity to have second-order affections is the moral sense, and virtuous individuals are those who are motivated to act on these affections. When moral sensibilities conflict, however, the conflict can be settled rationally by appealing to the objective notion of goodness. Gill argues that Shaftesbury's account of morality has problems with internal consistency, difficulties which Gill attributes to the attempt to combine rationalist anti-voluntarism with sentimentalist moral psychology. Shaftesbury's other major work on morality, The Moralists, is an inspiring piece that attempts to motivate people to become better by showing them the goodness of human nature. At the same time, it subsumes morality under beauty in an effort to show that standards of morality and beauty are objective and immutable, but also a matter of affections. Gill gives a lucid and engaging analysis of Shaftesbury's views. (I am one reader who has not admired Shaftesbury's own style.) We discover here that the God Shaftesbury depicts is a perfect artist and not a Christian God, and Gill argues that Shaftesbury's indifference to reconciling his ethical views with Christian theology is a momentous change in concerns from his predecessors.

Francis Hutcheson, born in 1694 in Ireland and the subject of Part Three, was educated into Presbyterian doctrines that echoed those of the Calvinists. Among the personal influences that led Hutcheson to reject the notion of natural human depravity were intellectuals in the Dublin community who were interested in the philosophy of Shaftesbury. Hutcheson shared with Shaftesbury a practical concern about the negative answer to the Human Nature Question, agreeing that if one is persuaded that human nature is selfish, then one is likely to behave selfishly. So, on Gill's interpretation, Hutcheson's assault on egoism and defense of a benevolent human nature were much more important to his system than his attacks on moral rationalism and subsequent defense of a moral sense were, contrary to the way his views have often been depicted.[3] Among Gill's arguments for this reading are (1) that the first edition of Hutcheson's Inquiry into the Original of our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue (one of his major works) has little to say about moral rationalism; (2) that Hutcheson's concern in writing about morality was a practical one, and the rationalists' views of morality were not a threat to virtue in the way the defense of egoism was; and (3) that Hutcheson himself treats the Illustrations on the Moral Sense, which contains his anti-rationalist arguments, as an appendix to his other main work, An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions and Affections.

Gill analyzes both Hutcheson's arguments against the egoists and his arguments against the moral rationalists. Hutcheson's positive picture is of human beings who are naturally benevolent and whose sentiments of approval and disapproval determine the standard of moral good and evil. This moral sense is one among many senses we possess, including the sense of honor (the capacity to be pleased at the esteem of others), the public sense (the capacity to be pleased at the happiness of others), and the aesthetic sense. Hutcheson argues that the possibility of conflicts between the moral senses of different people and within the senses of an individual is undermined by the fact that a good God guarantees that sentiments retained upon certain reflection will be those original to human nature, in harmony with one another, and good. Gill remarks on the implausibility of Hutcheson's account, which he suggests, along with Hume who was to follow, "is not the best explanation of the observable phenomena of human conduct" (194).

I will pause before moving to Part Four. I could suggest that the Human Nature Question is perhaps pressed into service a bit too much in Gill's narrative. I have no definitive argument for this allegation, but I do think some of the other pressing questions the British Moralists took up were perhaps just hard to separate from the Human Nature Question. Defending sentimentalism may not have been Hutcheson's primary aim, but I see his defense of the sensibility theory in moral and aesthetic value as more central than Gill does. In the preface to the Inquiry, 4th edition, Hutcheson notes that his chief aim is to show that human nature is attracted to the beauty of virtue. This can be read as segueing to a discussion of the virtue of human nature, but also as introducing the notion of moral and aesthetic sense, for which Hutcheson argues at length in the Inquiry. Hutcheson himself was never careful to distinguish the sentiments of senses from the sentiments that are motives to action. For instance, the public sense seems to be both the capacity to be pleased at the welfare of others and the source of the desire for the happiness of others. So, it is not surprising that the Human Nature Question is intertwined with the treatments of the senses in his texts.  However, this is not to argue that the rejection of the doctrine of the depravity of human nature was not the driving force on the whole behind the philosophical theories of these British moralists. Gill does muster convincing arguments that this is so, and the value of this line of interpretation is substantiated by the coherence of the picture it produces.

The plot comes to a climax and conclusion with Part Four. Here Gill depicts Hume as completing a Copernican Revolution in moral philosophy. Hume rejects the Human Nature Question entirely by recognizing that neither a positive nor a negative answer is appropriate. He rejects the Hutchesonian description of virtue as natural, arguing that what counts as virtue and as what counts as vice are determined by human nature. Thus he undermines the reasons Hutcheson offered for portraying God with the paramount role in morality of assuring that the natural and the good are consonant. Hume sharply severs the tie between theology and morality.

In Part Four, the discussion has a palpably different feel. Gill uses little of the historical and personal stage-setting that introduced the other philosophers. Perhaps this is indicative of the dramatic shift Gill is conveying, and he notes that Hume's approach to ethics (in A Treatise of Human Nature) is theoretical, not practical. Gill's discussion of Hume's moral philosophy represents as the core of his differences with Hutcheson the role each accords to mental associations. Whereas Hutcheson (following Locke) saw a passion or an idea that originated by mental association as removed from nature and untrustworthy (as, for example, associating a certain race with a certain temperament), Hume argues that the human tendency to associate ideas and impressions is productive of all manner of ideas and passions, some useful and some not. In particular, our distinctions between virtue and vice originate in sympathy, an associative process whereby we take on the feelings we imagine others to have, and then we temper those feelings by general habits of thought. Our distinction between justice and the injustice likewise relies on conventions that develop and change our original passions into ones that can move us according to rules that support social institutions. Gill also highlights the importance of the process of comparison, arguing that many judgments, like those of pride and beauty, depends crucially for Hume on comparisons: we don't take pride, for instance, in having something most everyone else has. Gill musters evidence from several quarters to make the point that, for Hume, judgments of moral goodness are also made in light of how one person's conduct measures up to the conduct of others; thus, he shows that Hume's theory is contingent in ways that Hutcheson's is not.

If Gill's analysis of Hume's use of comparison in morality is correct, then much of Hume scholarship has ignored an important component of Hume's moral theory. Gill's suggestion shows great insight in offering an explanation how moral distinctions arise out of human practices. Gill illustrates that the perspective from which we judge character according to Hume -- by discounting our interests and sympathizing with those directly affected by the agent -- is determined by what we can expect people to take into account when they act, given what they usually take into account. We don't expect an agent's awareness of the effects of her actions to extend to people at remote locations and times, and so we don't judge them on that basis. I find Gill's extraction of this lesson from Hume quite provocative. I do think he missed an opportunity here to take up a strand noted in the beginning, of the importance of being able to bear reflection on one's own character, a point emphasized in Hume and one that Gill interestingly found back in Whichcote.

Gill's book is written in a clear, inviting, and sometimes entertaining style. Here is just one example: "… [Hutcheson] also spent an inordinate amount of time pummeling the peculiar view of William Wollaston in what was really a pretty unfair fight between a philosophical middleweight and a philosophical featherweight" (166-67).  Another pleasing feature here is that Gill develops his historical theses by appealing to the primary sources in the main text, leaving discussion of the many secondary sources and commentaries to footnotes. This approach offers an uninterrupted presentation of the historical story, while still tendering to those interested in the many contemporary debates material for their consideration. I give this book a hearty recommendation for anyone with even a passing interest in the history of ethics. One need not be a scholar on these matters to enjoy and benefit from reading it. (Darwall's book by contrast has a scholarly apparatus that makes it much less accessible than Gill's.) Michael Gill's book is also indispensable for the scholar. I find myself in awe of his accomplishments here, and his book will undoubtedly be a touchstone for future discussions of early modern moral thought.

[1] Stephen Darwall, The British Moralists and the Internal Ought: 1640-1740 (Cambridge University Press, 1995).

[2]  J.B. Schneewind, The Invention of Autonomy: A History of Modern Moral Philosophy (Cambridge University Press, 1998).

[3] See, for instance, L.A. Selby-Bigge, The British Moralists (New York: Bobbs-Merrill, 1897/1964).