The Cambridge Companion to Adam Smith

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Knud Haakonssen (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Adam Smith, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 409pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521779243.

Reviewed by Eric Schliesser, Leiden University


The Cambridge Companion to Adam Smith is long overdue and disappointing.[1] The cover-blurb promises "direct philosophical engagement with" Smith's "ideas," but with the exceptions of a co-authored (and terrific) entry by Emma Rothschild and Amartya Sen and Charles Griswold's piece, there are no contributions by most of the leading philosophical Adam Smith scholars (e.g., Sam Fleischacker, Jim Otteson, Margaret Schabas, Maria Carrasco, Kate Abramson, and Leon Montes), nor by some of the most important contemporary philosophers who have engaged with Smith in their works (e.g., Charles Larmore, Stephen Darwall, Martha Nussbaum, Elizabeth Anderson, Alan Gibbard, Simon Blackburn, Gilbert Harman, and Paul Russell, and from different traditions Peter Sloterdijk and Ernst Tugendhat). Some of these oversights might be understood if we take into account the obvious long delay in publication of the Companion. References to the flood of works on Smith since, say 2000, are scarce.

This points to a more serious problem: excepting obligatory references to Hume, Smith's engagement with his philosophical contemporaries (whether Locke, Hutcheson, Mandeville, Berkeley, or the philosophes of the French Enlightenment) and Smith's writings on traditional philosophical matters (e.g., the notion of substance, the nature of perception, the Molyneux problem, skepticism, identity of the self, innate cognitive structure, moral luck, the nature of taste, etc.) are barely skimmed by most of the contributions, excepting Marcelo Dascal's and Christopher Berry's entries. Even when in the Companion recognizably philosophical topics are discussed (issues in philosophy of science, epistemology, aesthetics, moral psychology, philosophy of language, etc.), they are often penned by authors who are clearly writing their first piece on Adam Smith (and who could have benefited from some of their fellow contributors' entries or a deeper knowledge of existing literature on the topic[2] [even established scholars such as Dascal and Broadie fall in this category]), or whose primary interests are with the state of different disciplines. This Companion fails, with some exceptions (about which below), to stimulate engagement with the philosophical Adam Smith (who was, after all, a philosophy professor, first of logic and then of moral philosophy at the University of Glasgow between 1751-1764). The reader of the volume is, thus, deprived both of a contextual analysis of Smith's originality and depth and of a much needed critical analysis of his philosophy. As my examples of overlooked topics are meant to suggest, this point still holds if one allows that the content and nature of philosophy is contested and shifts over time.

The Companion has an anti-philosophical bias. This comes out not only in the ignored topics and the selection and intellectual orientation of the contributors, but also in the editor's treatment of the legacy of Smith. I offer three related examples. First, the entry by the distinguished historian J.G.A. Pocock, "Smith and History," never engages with the fact that Smith wrote quite a bit of history of philosophy (and philosophical histories of other intellectual activities, including natural science, astronomy, political economy, etc.). For example, a reader of Pocock's piece would never know that a century before Sidgwick, Smith devoted the final part of The Theory of Moral Sentiments (TMS; first edition in 1759) to one of the earliest detailed and competent (albeit controversial) histories of moral philosophy in the English language from Plato to then contemporary times! (In Douglas Long's entry, "Adam Smith's Politics," some of this material is mentioned briefly at 307-9.) Second, the Companion entirely ignores important bits of philosophical writing on Smith by, for example, Glenn Morrow (now mostly known for his majestic scholarly work on Plato and Proclus) in the 1920s[3] and Arthur Prior in his once-influential Logic and the Basis of Ethics (1949), which has perceptive and admiring insights on Smith. C.D. Broad reviewed Prior's book in Mind, and in the last line singled out the treatment of Adam Smith's work, "which is fallen into quite undeserved neglect."[4]  Third, Prior's interest in Smith is especially noteworthy. I am not claiming that Prior got his interest in intensional or tense logic from Smith. But Smith, who burned most of his unpublished papers on his deathbed, did intentionally leave us a fragment of a piece on ancient logics (note the plural) as well as a draft of a piece on ancient metaphysics. It is unfortunate that there are no articles on these elements of Smith's philosophical interest in the Companion.

Moreover, the influential readings of Smith by Rawls and Foucault, which might frame the reception of Smith's ideas by many contemporary students and non-specialist scholars, are ignored; even Marx and Mill (Durkheim, etc.), whose competing interpretations overshadowed the reception of Smith until the end of the Cold War, are barely mentioned. Even Smith's continuing relevance in contemporary debates over the status of Liberalism, globalization, the role of the state, is surprisingly weakly served by this Companion.

I speak of a 'bias' in accounting for the Companion's ignorance of philosophical work by and on Adam Smith. This claim is inspired by reflection on the editor's two (out of thirteen) contributions to the volume. (Besides the "Introduction," Haakonssen has a co-authored piece with Donald Winch on "The Legacy of Adam Smith.") Even though six of the remaining entries have titles indicating some concern with Smith's moral theory (there is considerable overlap and repetition in this Companion), Haakonssen goes out of his way to deny that Smith's moral theory addresses any questions that might be of interest to contemporary philosophers in normative theory, normative moral psychology, meta-ethics, or the metaphysics of morals (5, 380-88). Now, while Haakonssen and Winch might be motivated by a desire to correct the anachronistic tendency to look at Early Modern philosophy primarily through the prism of contemporary metaphysics, epistemology and meta-ethics, they work with a false and anachronistic dichotomy: given that Smith is evidently interested in offering a "causal" (385) and "empirical account of the emergence of moral judgments as a practice among people" (384), Smith cannot have had "concepts of moral obligation, rightness, and goodness" (385). Haakonssen and Winch simply deny that Smith has a "normative theory of ethics" (381) (in the "Introduction," Haakonnssen allows that Smith's theory has a "very indirect normativity" [5]). It is ironic that those who insist on reading Smith contextually (380) tacitly introduce a very anachronistic version of the fact-value distinction into their analysis; Haakonssen and Winch seem to be thinking that if Smith intends to offer a causal, factual, 'scientific' account, he cannot be offering a value-laden account, too.

Haakonssen and Winch must, thus, discount evidence from "Smith's contemporaries" (i.e., anti-Smithian Common Sense philosophers) that Smith may be interested in a "normative moral psychology" (380). Because of their positivist conception of 'science,' it seems inconceivable to Haakonssen and Winch that, in the eighteenth century, establishing the nature of morality may in fact connect with normative theory. For Smith, one of the 'factual' questions that a moral theory had to answer was simultaneously a moral one: "wherein does virtue consist? Or what is the tone of temper, and tenour of conduct, which constitutes the excellent and praise-worthy character, the character which is the natural object of esteem, honour, and approbation?" (TMS VII.1.2). Throughout TMS, Smith goes out of his way to establish what conduct is praise-worthy, and he then employs that account to denounce (or commend) other moral theorists (and ordinary human beings). For example, in the context of explaining how custom can corrupt and pervert moral judgment, Smith criticizes "humane Plato" for not condemning infanticide but rather giving "sanction to so dreadful a violation of humanity" (TMS V 2.15). In his lucid entry, "Smith and Science," Christopher Berry uses the same example to make this very point (134-35). Haakonssen's failure to appreciate this is puzzling, especially because Griswold's piece, "Imagination: Morals, Science, Arts," tacitly demolishes Haakonssen's related idea (cf. 5) that there is no metaphysics of morals in Smith. By drawing on work of Martha Nussbaum and by quoting Smith's claim that the impartial spectator not only "surveys," but also is "the natural and original measure" of virtue, Griswold nicely shows that the impartial spectator is "constitutive" and "defining" of the moral outlook (38-40). Smith's interest in moral epistemology is also signaled by these phrases.

Griswold's and Berry's pieces are usefully read in tandem. Both emphasize the importance of the imagination in Smith's moral and epistemological theorizing. Griswold tends to read skeptical and constructivist views into Smith's remarks (50-5), but I agree with Berry that such claims are overblown and the evidence for them misconstrued (123). Nevertheless, one especially important and interesting aspect of Griswold's piece is his taxonomy of the "spectrum of sympathy" (27) that one can identify in TMS (27-38). This makes Griswold's entry an important starting point for future research, together with important (uncited) articles by Stephen Darwall and the economist Robert Sugden, as well as by David Levy and Sandra Peart.[5] Smith uses "sympathy" in technical and often equivocal ways, and develops the nature of the mechanism in different directions throughout TMS. I would emphasize more than most commentators have done thus far that even as a mechanism of the imagination that aims at fellow feeling with the passions of others, sympathy can involve several layers of counterfactual (and very speedy) reasoning in which perspectives on the causal factors of a situation and what it would be appropriate to feel are processed. Unfortunately, much of Griswold's insights or those derived from the recent literature on sympathy are not appreciated by Alexander Broadie in his "Sympathy and the Impartial Spectator," (presumably because it was written in the late 1990s). Moreover, Broadie recycles the canard invented by the editors in the introduction to the Glasgow edition of TMS to forestall the "Das Adam Smith Problem" (that is, that Adam Smith's two main works, TMS and Wealth of Nations are fundamentally at odds), that "sympathy is not the motive for moral action nor indeed is it a motive at all" (164-65). This view of sympathy is cited without evidence and it has already been decisively refuted by Leon Montes.[6] Broadie's position also implies an impoverished view of the importance and nature of self-interest in Smith's Wealth of Nations (WN, first edition 1776). One wishes that before writing his contribution to the Companion, Broadie had read Sen's and Rothschild's piece, which marvelously explains how "Smith's economic writings … present a subtle and diverse view of individual motivations" (357), or even Pratap Bhanu Mehta's entry ("Self Interest and Other Interest") which illustrates "the complexity of Smith's account of self-interest" (269) and that self-interest "is a term suffused with moral connotations" (247). One of the redeeming features of this Companion is that several entries recognize the moral significance of important elements of WN (see also, David Lieberman's treatment of "Adam Smith on Justice, Rights, and Law").[7]

Griswold and Broadie both pursue the similarities between Smith's claims about morality and epistemology. They put effort into showing that in the epistemological sphere sympathy plays no role for Smith. For Broadie this is the case because one cannot sympathize with nature (176-77). This is mistaken because Smith allows (limited) sympathy with nature, in part, because we naturally anthropomorphize nature.[8] Griswold (47) has the more interesting argument based on a passage in TMS (I.i.4.2), which suggests that when we are measuring and inferring things (e.g., "the proportions of different quantities and numbers, the various appearances which the great machine of the universe is perpetually exhibiting, with the secret wheels and springs which produce them") there is in our judgments no need for that "imaginary change of situations" that is part of the sympathetic process. But from this it does not follow, as Griswold claims, that sympathy is not required at all in "intellectual pursuits." (Griswold actually does not mention measurement or inference or quote the part of Smith I just quoted; he just speaks of "intellectual endeavor characteristic of the natural sciences," but this does not do justice to Smith's argument.) For, Smith has a decisively social epistemology (see the hint of this in Berry's piece [119]), as investigators of nature sympathize with the anticipated reaction of other or imagined (impartial) members of the community of inquirers to proposed theories that connect the measurements and inferences. This is why in his published and posthumously published writings whenever Smith treats of intellectual matters he often mentions "applause," public opinion," "fame," the split between vulgar and expert opinion, differences among experts, etc. Smith realizes that natural philosophy is more than just measurement and inference; there is a whole process of setting standards, deciding on criteria, and offering reasons to other inquirers that can involve sympathetic judgments.[9] Smith's writings are relevant for the sociology of knowledge and the history of naturalized epistemology.

Berry's piece calls attention to some of Smith's otherwise overlooked philosophical debts to a Lockean anthropology, which equates the savage mind to children (128). Berry also notes the importance of Hume's essay, "Of National Characters," to understanding the 18th century distinction between "moral" and "physical" causes in Smith's "soft-determinist," institution-centric causal explanations (130). This phrase captures the predominant mode of explanation in Smith also emphasized in the wonderful entry on "Adam Smith's Economics" by Rothschild and Sen (355). They show that Smith's economics is itself recognizable as moral and political philosophy if one is willing to read the text.[10] Besides calling attention to many aspects of the moral and political outlook of WN (and doing more justice to Smith's views on morality and politics than the entries by Broadie or Long), they emphasize the moral importance of Smith's "presumption of the natural equality of all individuals" (324). Unsurprisingly, they have an eye for Smith's emphasis on the agency of the colonized (e.g., 342-44, cf. Pocock, 285; it is also instructive to compare Rothschild and Sen on Smith's views on religion [353] with Pocock's misleading comments [282-83]).

Rothschild and Sen emphasize that while Smith noted many moral improvements associated with commerce (probity, self-discipline, increased support for rule of law, moral independence, etc.), commerce can also stimulate "human folly and injustice" (Smith repeatedly descries the injustice of European colonialism) and pernicious attempts by business elites to hijack the political process to their narrow and selfish interests (e.g., 341-43). This suggests that Smith disagrees with Hume's well known claim (in his essay "Of Commerce") that commercial improvement coincides with improvement in humanity. For Smith, progress also involves various kinds of moral losses, too.[11] (Dascal also notes that for Smith the development of modern languages systematically prevents many other desirable "rhetorical virtues" [98]). This is my only minor disagreement with Berry because he implies that Smith is "a fully paid-up member" of a progressivist "Enlightenment family" (135). Smith certainly advocated the "natural progress of improvement" and hoped that with more economic growth (due to extensive division of labour, technological innovation, mutually beneficial trade, protection of property rights, etc.) poverty would diminish and that with the spread of science there would be a "great antidote to superstition" (135; quoting WN). But Smith also called attention to the fact that the division of labour itself can cause "gross ignorance and stupidity" among workers doing dull, repetitive work. Smith advocates commercial progress on humanitarian, moral, and political grounds, but he is not blind to its potential pernicious side-effects. It is, thus, surprising that this Companion pays scant attention to the rich literature on Smith's (and Hume's) engagement with Rousseau's criticism of commercial life.[12]

Two of the best pieces in the volume are by a historian, Mark Salber Phillips' "Adam Smith, Belletrist," and an economist, Neil de Marchi's "Smith on Ingenuity, Pleasure and the Imitative Arts." Phillips focuses his expert eye on the remaining student notes of Smith's lectures on rhetoric and belles-lettres, while De Marchi analyzes important elements of a posthumously published essay, "On the Nature of that Imitation which takes place in what are called the Imitative Arts" (also deliberately saved from the flames). Both pieces show that Smith thought carefully about the arts as such, but also that Smith intended to re-conceptualize how one should think about and experience the variety of persuasions and pleasures in a world dominated by Christian and Ancient exemplars. The aim of Smith's enterprise is not merely to make a moral argument on behalf of commerce and the alleviation of poverty, but also to find a source of value for the "ennobling" side-products of the division of labour (i.e., the arts, sciences, and philosophy).[13]

Finally, I turn to Marcelo Dascal's admiringly ambitious contribution, "Adam Smith's Theory of Language." It identifies several important principles that operate in Smith's often overlooked essay, "Considerations Concerning the First Formation of Languages," which Smith published with the third edition of TMS. (Bizarrely, Smith's modern editors removed it from that volume.) Dascal notes that for Smith there are "instructive divergences" among the "best system of grammar, the best system of logic, and the best history of the natural progress of the human mind"; these are not all "mirror images of each other" (96). (This is another reason to suspect that Smith recognized trade-offs among different kinds of progress!) Moreover, Dascal's account of Smith's treatment of language shows that widespread, lazy readings of Smith as a Humean Empiricist philosopher can be misleading. Dascal traces Smith's orientation to Condillac's understanding of sensations as "thoroughly blended and mixed wholes" (94), far removed from "Hume's impressions" (85). While Smith's analysis can sometimes indeed be usefully read as an attempt to supplement or go beyond Hume's "science of man,"[14] Dascal's particular case would have been more compelling had he explained why Smith also uses the Humean language of "impressions" and "ideas" scattered throughout his writings (Griswold [24, 30] and Broadie [163] cite a prominent example from the first page of TMS). On the theme of rejecting Hume, it would have been more promising if Dascal had explored the consequences of his own observation that for Smith "the distinctions of persons (which express 'ideas extremely metaphysical and abstract,' [Dascal is quoting Smith] -- especially the first person)" is a cultural/historical/linguistic achievement (95). Smith's position becomes interesting if we see him as responding to Hume's challenge of finding an impression corresponding to 'self.'

Many contributions to the Companion emphasize how Smith's focus on the importance of the constructive role of the imagination in theoretical and moral enterprises is indebted to Hume, yet none observe that Smith is virtually silent about the mental, causal mechanisms (or principles of association, that is, the natural relations) that do so much work in Hume's account. (Griswold, 47, even attributes -- somewhat implausibly -- to Smith a conception of "theoretical reason," cf. Rothschild and Sen, 357-58.) Moreover, while Dascal rightly notes that Smith's treatment of language ought to help us in thinking about how Smith views the relationship between mind, language, and world, Dascal fails to note that Smith is committed to the existence of the very un-Humean (albeit Epicurean) notion of  "preconceptions" in the mind (see Smith's posthumously published essay, "Of the External Senses").[15] In Smith, "preconceptions" are a kind of innate "vague idea" that instinctively draws us to certain objects. I am unfamiliar with published scholarship on Smith that even takes this fact of Smith's position into account. Perhaps, we can hope not to have to wait too long for a revised edition of the Cambridge Companion to Adam Smith, which will include entries on the details of Smith's philosophy?[16]

[1] Disclaimer: I am the co-editor with Leon Montes of a competing volume (2006) New Voices on Adam Smith (Routledge) with a foreword by Knud Haakonssen.

[2] Marcelo Dascal falls in this category: he seems unaware of Christopher Berry's pioneering (1974) "Adam Smith's Considerations on Language," Journal of the History of Ideas, 35(1): 130-138, or David M. Levy's (1997) "Adam Smith's rational choice linguistics," Economic Inquiry 35(3): 672-678. More unfortunately, Dascal also equates Smith's conception of "sympathy" with "altruism" (101 n.30) -- a view long rejected in the scholarly literature (see, for example, Alexander Broadie's contribution to the volume, which represents the consensus view against it; see, e.g., [164-65]).

[3] For example, Glenn R. Morrow (1923) "The Significance of the Doctrine of Sympathy in Hume and Adam Smith," The Philosophical Review, 32(1): 60-78, and Glenn R. Morrow (1923) The ethical and economic theories of Adam Smith: a study in the social philosophy of the eighteenth century, Ithaca: Cornel University Press.

[4] C. D. Broad, Review of Arthur N. Prior's Logic and the Basis of Ethics Mind 59 (1950): 392-395; <>, accessed July 15, 2007.

[5] Stephen Darwall (1998) "Empathy, Sympathy, Care," Philosophical Studies 89(2): 261-282 and (1999) "Sympathetic Liberalism: Recent Work on Adam Smith," Philosophy and Public Affairs, 28(2): 139-164; Robert Sugden (2002) "Beyond sympathy and empathy: Adam Smith's concept of fellow-feeling," Economics and Philosophy, 18: 63-87; David M. Levy and Sandra J. Peart (2004) "Sympathy and Approbation in Hume and Smith: a solution to the other rational species problem," Economics and Philosophy, 20: 331-349.

[6] Leonidas Montes (2004) Adam Smith in Context, London: Palgrave Macmillan, pp. 45-55. Even the editor of the Glasgow edition of TMS, D.D. Raphael, concedes Montes' point (see Raphael [2007] The Impartial Spectator: Adam Smith's Moral Philosophy, Oxford: OUP, 120).

[7] See also Eric Schliesser (2006) "Articulating Practices as Reasons: Adam Smith on the Conditions of Possibility of Property," Adam Smith Review, Vol. 2: 69-97.

[8] For the full argument see Patrick Frierson (2006) "Adam Smith and the Possibility of Sympathy with Nature," Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 87(4): 442-480.

[9] For the issues discussed in this paragraph see, Eric Schliesser (2005) "Wonder in the face of scientific revolutions: Adam Smith on Newton's 'Proof' of Copernicanism," British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 13(4): 697-732.

[10] See also Samuel Fleischacker (2004) On Adam Smith's Wealth of Nations: a Philosophical Companion, Princeton: Princeton University Press.

[11] Maureen Harkin's (2002) "Natives and Nostalgia: The Problem of the North American Savage in Adam Smith's Historiography," Scottish Studies Review (3): 25-28 and her (2005) "Adam Smith's Missing History: Primitives, Progress, and Problems of Genre," English Literary History, 72: 429-451 explore in the manner of a literary theorist the competing visions (and their sources) of 'progress' in Smith.

[12] See, for example, Spencer J. Pack (2000) "The Rousseau Smith Connection: Towards Understanding Professor West's Splenetic Smith," History of Economic Ideas VIII 2:35-62; Pierre Force (2003) Self-Interest Before Adam Smith: a Genealogy of Economic Science, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; Jimena Hurtado (2004) "Bernard Mandeville's heir: Adam Smith or Jean Jacques Rousseau on the possibility of economic analysis," European Journal of the History of Economics, (1): 1-31; Eric Schliesser (2006) "The Self-Interest of a Benevolent Philosopher: Adam Smith's Conception of Philosophy," New Voices on Adam Smith, Edited by Montes & Schliesser (London: Routledge), 328-357; Ryan Hanley (Forthcoming, 2008) "Commerce and Corruption: Rousseau's Diagnosis and Adam Smith's Cure," European Journal of Political Theory.

[13] See Eric Schliesser (2006) "The Self-Interest of a Benevolent Philosopher: Adam Smith's Conception of Philosophy," New Voices on Adam Smith, Edited by Montes & Schliesser (Routledge), 328-357.

[14] See Spencer Pack and Eric Schliesser (2006) "Adam Smith's 'Humean' Criticism of Hume's Account of Origin of Justice," Journal for the History of Philosophy 44(1): 47-63. See also the argument in Schliesser 2005.

[15] I thank Martha Nussbaum and Catherine Wilson for discussion on this point.

[16] I thank Ryan Hanley for comments on an earlier draft.