The Cambridge Companion to Ancient Ethics

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Christopher Bobonich (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Ancient Ethics, Cambridge, 2017, 395 pp., $29.99 (pbk) ISBN 9781107652316.

Reviewed by Brad Inwood, Yale University


The blurb on the back of the book says that "the field of ancient Greek ethics is increasingly emerging as a major branch of philosophical enquiry," but that claim is too cautious. Ancient ethics has been an important area of philosophical work for quite a long time already, so there is all the more reason to welcome the appearance of a well-planned and well-executed Companion in the familiar Cambridge mode. Christopher Bobonich has assembled a strong team of established and emerging authorities in the field; in eighteen chapters (of remarkably consistent size, about 15 pages each) the book covers a wider range of topics than one might have expected, though some readers (like this one) will look for more. Something that makes the ancient Greco-Roman world a particularly rewarding period in the history of ethics is the vigour of philosophical dialogue between ancient ethics and contemporary work in the field, and several of the essays in the Companion bring that out well.

The historical scope of the book is broad, including a probing exploration of ethics in the Pre-Socratic period and a compendious consideration of ethics in later Platonism (Plotinus and beyond), both of which argue convincingly for the importance of these often-slighted periods. Indeed, the book's organization is largely historical. Part I (Origins) contains André Laks' essay 'What Is Pre-Socratic Ethics?' and David Wolfsdorf's treatment of a more predictable topic, 'The Historical Socrates.' Parts II and III are devoted to Plato and Aristotle and are strictly symmetrical. Each part contains an essay on 'Virtue and Happiness' (Daniel Devereux on Plato, David Charles on Aristotle), one on 'Ethical Psychology' (Rachana Kamtekar on Plato and Jessica Moss on Aristotle) and one on 'Love and Friendship' (Frisbee Sheffield on Plato and Corinne Gartner on Aristotle). Part IV tackles post-Aristotelian philosophy with chapters on Epicurus and the Epicureans (Raphael Woolf), on the Sceptics (Luca Castagnoli) and on later Platonism (Dominic O'Meara); the Stoics are represented by two chapters, one on 'Virtue and Happiness' by Katja Vogt and one on their 'Ethical Psychology' by Margaret Graver. The editor clearly saw that Stoic ethics maps more closely onto the central themes in Plato and Aristotle than any of the other later schools. It would have been procrustean to devote a chapter to Stoic views on love and friendship, but that space could easily have been taken up by dedicating a chapter to a more extended treatment of friendship and social relations in Epicureanism than Woolf had room for in his essay.

Part V sets aside the historical framework and presents five magisterial essays on particular issues. Julia Annas revisits some central themes from her earlier work (especially The Morality of Happiness) in 'Ancient Eudaimonism and Modern Morality.' Richard Kraut tackles a topic of exceptional systematic interest, 'Partiality and Impartiality in Ancient Ethics.' Bobonich grapples with the perennial problem of 'Elitism in Plato and Aristotle,' and David Sedley explores the role of 'Becoming Godlike' in ancient ethical theory. The book concludes with an essay by Terence Irwin on the perhaps surprising topic of 'Horace and Practical Philosophy.'

This plan reveals the editor's generous understanding of the scope of ancient ethics, and so it may seem unreasonable to ask for more. Nevertheless, it's worth noting that Aristotle's Eudemian Ethics is underrepresented (with the honourable exception of Gartner's treatment of the book on friendship); Aristotle's ethics in this Companion is very traditionally Nicomachean in focus. And it seems that ancient ethics is (as the blurb confesses) essentially Greek. With the exception of Irwin on Horace (not normally thought of as a central figure in ancient ethical theorizing), Latin authors are barely noticed. Of course, Cicero is often pulled in as a source of information about other philosophers, but, although his own contributions to ethics were not negligible, they are neglected here, and Seneca does not even appear in the index. When one thinks about the importance of On Duties and the Moral Epistles to the later history of European thought, the silence about such works is clearly audible. Thus, despite the inclusion of Pre-Socratics and later Platonism, the conception of the ancient ethical tradition remains, for better or worse, fairly conventional. The Cynics, the Pythagoreans and other important outliers are marginal, if not totally absent, though the Cyrenaics are well discussed by Annas in their now familiar role as the anomalous non-eudaimonists of the ancient world; they appear again in Irwin's chapter, thanks to Horace's interest in their distinctive brand of hedonism. The familiar wall between pagans and religious thinkers remains intact (no patristic authors, not even those whose fusion of philosophical ethics and faith was influential among the Cambridge Platonists; we get Philo of Larisa, but not Philo of Alexandria; there's not a gnostic in sight).

Let me turn to particulars. This is not an easy thing to do, as the roster of authors includes several friends, collaborators and even a colleague of this reviewer. The Pre-Socratics are traditionally thought of as pre-ethical philosophers, thanks to the tradition stemming from Aristotle that makes Socrates responsible for the ethical turn. But any reader of early Greek philosophers can see an abundance of views and even arguments on ethics (think of Xenophanes' critique of the Homeric gods and construction of a rational philosopher's god; Pythagorean and Empedoclean theories, not to mention Orphics, that connect good and bad behaviour with the fate of the soul after death). With Aristotelian hindsight, these early thinkers were turned into exponents of physics and/or theology. Hence André Laks' methodologically bold exploration of the relationship between ethics and physics in several early philosophers provides important insights. Some theories (such as those of Philolaus and Xenophanes) rely on close correspondence between the human and the cosmological spheres; others (e.g., Anaxagoras and Diogenes of Apollonia) rely on the stark separation of these domains; and yet others (e.g., Empedocles) develop and exploit a tension between them. A very helpful matrix to work with, but I still wondered what to do about Heraclitus, whom Laks omits. Over all, Laks' approach is more sociological and structural than dialectically philosophical, but it is none the worse for that.

On more familiar territory, some of the essays provide relatively conventional treatments. Wolfsdorf's Socrates comes out as more politically motivated than one might expect, but otherwise we get a thorough and responsible treatment of what little we can know of a philosopher who himself wrote nothing. The chapters on 'Virtue and Happiness' in Plato and Aristotle, by Devereux and Charles respectively, stand in contrast. After a balanced assessment of the 'Socratic' dialogues, Devereux focusses on a contrast between the Phaedo and the Republic and ends with a quick but perceptive treatment of the Philebus and the Laws. By contrast, Charles gives us a tough (in both senses) analysis and reassessment of the function argument and of the role of the kalon in the conceptual foundations of Aristotle's ethics. Anything but conventional, this essay provokes serious rethinking of the core ideas in the Nicomachean Ethics, including the 'function argument.'

One thing that the Companion brings out clearly is just how distinctive ancient ethics is in recognizing the interdependence of ethical theory and moral psychology. The line between what is here called 'ethical' psychology and ethics is often very fine in the ancient world, and that is especially true of Plato, Aristotle and the Stoics. Each of these gets its own chapter on the topic, and the issue figures in the Epicurus chapter as well. Kamtekar tracks a development from Plato's early views to his more complex analysis of psychological parts and the philosophical rationale for positing them; there has been much recent work on this theme, some of it in the collection Plato and the Divided Self edited by Barney, Brennan and Brittain (Cambridge 2012), not mentioned here. Jessica Moss has distinctive views on Aristotle's moral psychology, developed in Aristotle and the Apparent Good (Oxford 2012) and elsewhere; those views play out well in this chapter. Moss's view of the function argument differs noticeably from that of David Charles, but, as often happens in Companions and Handbooks, we get no dialogue between chapters (more's the pity). Turning to the Stoics, whose moral psychology was built on the denial of significant partition in the soul, we find Margaret Graver's excellent and economical analysis. Rather a lot of emphasis is placed on the role of the passions, which reflects the ancient sources for Stoic theory and Stoic views themselves; but she includes an important and innovative sketch for what she labels "Stoic character theory" which opens up a promising new approach to aspects of Stoic ethics.

Another distinguishing feature of ancient ethical theory is its preoccupation with friendship and other close social relations. Frisbee Sheffield take us through the obvious dialogues on this topic (Symposium and Phaedrus) and, through her treatment of erōs, touches on important features of the Republic. Surprising, though valuable, is her further extension into the more political aspect of philia in the Laws in a discussion that helps to show why friendship and love played such a central role in ancient ethics. It is a shame that the Lysis could only be mentioned in passing, for it might have served to connect some dots between Plato's and Aristotle's theories of friendship. Corinne Gartner's chapter on Aristotle brings out nicely the relation of her topic to contemporary interests. Despite bogging down somewhat in a careful consideration of other specialist interpretations (particularly Whiting, Nehamas and Cooper), she does a skillful job of probing Aristotle's theory in both the Eudemian and Nicomachean versions, with particularly interesting speculations about Aristotle's concept of the self -- the "agent is essentially her virtue," a claim that I would like to see discussed in light of Aristotle's claim that a person is "most of all" her intellect (nous, 1168b35-1169a2). The essay concludes with a fresh and attractive analysis of the grounds for dissolution of the different kinds of friendships that Aristotle recognizes.

Each of the chapters on post-Aristotelian developments stands alone. Woolf on the Epicureans gives a characteristically lucid exposition of the essentials, with a welcome emphasis on the range of intrinsic pleasures recognized by Epicurus, a consideration which mitigates some of the counterintuitive features of their theory. He breaks new ground with his discussion of the claim that the virtue of justice is indispensable for the happy, i.e., pleasant life. Perhaps, Woolf suggests, it is not just the near certainty of being caught in acts of selfish rule-breaking and the attendant anxiety that makes justice instrumentally valuable -- that is the usual explanation, and Woolf is right to see its weakness. His new suggestion is that it is not only the fear of detection that makes injustice a foolish strategy; rather, "it may be that we are supposed to see the need to live covertly as itself unpleasant; and this indeed may explain why it is covert, rather than overt, practices that he focuses on" (p. 177). This promising speculation answers to a real philosophical puzzle, but I wonder how it relates to Epicurus' positive recommendation to "live undetected" (lathe biōsas).

Vogt's account of Stoicism focusses on the early school as the locus of orthodoxy in their ethical theory; the innovator Aristo is treated as a renegade -- which is indeed how the early leaders of the school saw him. But his persistent recognition as an important voice in Stoic ethics by later figures, such as Seneca and Marcus Aurelius, goes unmentioned and unexplained. Vogt emphasizes the theory of virtue throughout: are the virtues truly unified, or just inter-entailing? How should we understand the claim that logic, physics and ethics, the parts of philosophical theory, are themselves virtues? She tackles other central themes: the nature of the good and its relationship to other values (the indifferents) and the telos or end. Stoic ethics is a lot to fit into less than fifteen pages, and Vogt has made the unavoidable hard choices about where to focus.

'Sceptical ethics' is sometimes thought to be a contradiction, but in the ancient world it was not. Castagnoli economically outlines Academic arguments on ethics, then turns to the Pyrrhonists, each school's strategy being integrated with their general sceptical approach. His treatment is philosophically acute and well contextualized for contemporary ethical theorists. Castagnoli takes into account the many scholarly controversies about Pyrrhonist ethics (there is greater consensus about the Academics) and explores their respective accounts of the possibility of practical life without beliefs, concluding with an acute discussion of the Pyrrhonian telos produced by sceptical suspension. This is a compact and lucid introduction to ancient scepticism generally, as well as to sceptical ethics.

For most readers, later Platonic ethics will be new territory. Recognizing that, O'Meara focusses on Plotinus and sets out as much as is needed of his psychology and metaphysics to make the ethics properly intelligible. In his mildly apologetic discussion, O'Meara distinguishes the ethical theory we find in Plotinus' writings from the less plausible image of late Platonist ethics inspired by hagiographical views of his sage-like life. The scope of post-Plotinian developments in ethics is clearly immense, and O'Meara economically gestures at what still needs to be done. I would have welcomed a more extended discussion of how Plotinus' own theory relates to Platonic and Aristotelian texts, but that would require far more space than the author had at his disposal.

The final section of the book deals with a somewhat miscellaneous set of more general philosophical themes. Annas contrasts eudaimonism with two dominant modern theories of morality, Kantian and utilitarian, defending the basic reasonableness of the ancient approach against some common criticisms: that it is selfish or egoistic and that it fails to be action-guiding in the way that we expect of a moral theory.

Richard Kraut argues, against many, that much of ancient ethics satisfies the expectation that a moral theory be impartial or provide impartial guidance and that the contrast between ancient and modern ethics in this respect is not as stark as is usually supposed. He begins with the Stoic Hecaton's famous case of 'lifeboat ethics', which seems to mandate impartial dispute resolution (Cicero, On Duties 3.89-90), then turns to Stoicism more generally. It emerges as an impartial way of organizing the world if there are system-level general reasons for having each agent exercise some level of local partiality. It may be for the best for everyone impartially if each gives special weight to the concerns of family and close friends. This local partiality is essential if we are all to enjoy the benefits of strong and supportive social networks. Hence, as long as we keep our eyes focussed on the universal level, considering things from the point of view of an overall rational providence, we can see impartialism in the organization of the cosmos by a deity who has no reason to prefer one rational agent over another. In this way, the partiality which every animal, including humans, manifests is subsumed under a larger, law-like plan that justifies local apparent imbalances (a theory roughly comparable to rule utilitarianism). As Cleanthes says in the Hymn to Zeus (LS 54I3): "You know how to make things crooked straight and to order things disorderly . . . You have so welded into one all things good and bad that they all share in a single everlasting reason . . . "

Whether this higher-level resolution of the partiality built into each individual agent will satisfy critics who complain about the Stoic lack of impartiality is an open question. Why should it, if one is not committed to the Stoic providential world view? If the challenge to Stoic theory can only be met by accepting their theological cosmology whole hog, how much good does that do us in regular philosophical debate? In short, is Stoic impartiality our sense of impartiality? A further concern is whether Stoic cosmic law is really as impartial as the language of 'law' suggests. In book two of On the Nature of the Gods (2.164-165), the Stoic spokesman clearly recognizes that god makes preferential dispensations for some individuals. God's playing field may not in fact be perfectly level, especially if sages like Socrates and Heracles (Zeus' son, after all) get special privileges.

Kraut also addresses Platonist impartiality, which again is to be achieved when the whole is privileged over the parts or when we focus on a mission, like that of Socrates, imposed on us by a superior being. It is because "Plato conceives of the created cosmos as an orderly whole that is supervised by gods who care about human life [sc. in general]" that we can play our role in an impartial system. (I pass over here Kraut's brief discussion of Epicureanism, which lacks the resources to support impartialism of any sort, and Aristotle, for whom, according to Kraut, "individual actions are justified by bringing them under a general rule whose operation can be approved when one looks at its results from the perspective of the whole community" [p. 295].)

Both the Stoic and Platonist flavours of impartiality leave open the question whether the impartiality Kraut finds in these ancient systems is what we are looking for when we worry about the issue. It would be interesting to compare Annas' approach to such issues with this one, not least because Annas argued in The Morality of Happiness (Oxford 1993) that one ought to be able to defend key parts of the Stoic theory without invoking their theological cosmology (ch. 5). Both take Sidgwick as a foil, but their defense of some ancient theories seems to presuppose different conceptions of the challenge. But the Companion format discourages this kind of dialogue between contributors and these issues are left for readers to think through on their own.

A similar sort of question lingers at the end of David Sedley's account of godlikeness in Plato and Aristotle. This is a rich and detailed defense of the essential role played in Plato's ethics by the notion of a superior god that we are to emulate, enhanced by a sustained argument that Aristotle is much closer to Plato on such matters than many of his modern defenders think. If we are interested in understanding how ancient ethics squares with modern philosophical debate, it may be that the more historically accurate we find Kraut's and Sedley's understandings of ancient ethics to be, the more remote it becomes from our own philosophical concerns.

Like Annas and Kraut, Bobonich also takes up a common critique of ancient ethics and develops a plausible defense. In this case, it is the charge of unjustifiable elitism. It is often held that the perfectionism of ancient ethical theories imposes needless barriers to virtue and happiness, so that all too few can even hope to achieve this end and even fewer actually do. It is not just that the bar is set high; many moral theories are demanding, and there is nothing wrong with that. But since human psychological capacities are variable, there might, on some moral theories, be whole classes of people who cannot even aspire to virtue because they simply lack the capacity for it. The extreme case would surely be Aristotle's natural slaves, or women; but if happiness demands intellectual excellence, or the soul of a Platonic guardian, that still leaves large groups of people, perhaps a majority, who cannot even hope to become fully virtuous and happy. Though in principle this may be true, most people will suppose that a moral theory which condemns so many to a second-class life is to that extent disappointing, even defective.

Bobonich gives us a Plato who develops from a highly elitist thinker for whom only the philosophically gifted can succeed to a more moderate, though not radically democratic, theorist in the Laws. He also gives us an Aristotle of a moderately optimistic bent; at least in principle, all "normal" Greek males at least have a shot at success, even if the bad organization and defective education in most societies de facto condemn the majority to failure. When noting that "it is not beyond the capacities of the well-habituated and educated normal Greek male with adequate leisure" (p. 313, my emphasis) to achieve the requisite practical wisdom, I fear that Bobonich may be slightly insensitive to the significance of economic class in creating and sustaining opportunities for ethical success. Regrettably, the chapter omits consideration of Stoicism, a philosophy whose idealistic conception of virtue is genuinely universal, available to any rational animal on exactly the same terms, regardless of the distribution of external goods and opportunities. To be sure, actual success in achieving virtue is in fact rarer for Stoics than it would be for Plato and Aristotle, but their theory affords, at least in principle, the kind of uniform opportunity for success that Plato and Aristotle fail to provide.

Irwin addresses the issue of what we might call 'real world' applications of ethical theory. Precisely because he is not a philosopher, Horace enables us to confront problems that many moral theorists systematically evade. What does the average Joe do about ethics? Moral philosophy is demanding and complicated, and the non-philosopher inevitably asks himself how much all this theory matters anyway. In his Epistles, especially, Horace takes the stance of an Epicurean-inclined eclectic, and, in exploring the implications of this complex posture, Irwin puts the practical side of ancient ethics into a fascinating meta-ethical framework, thereby opening up a potentially large-scale enquiry into the place of moral theory in ancient culture. Whatever one might think of the situation in the ancient world, this sophisticated analysis raises in the mind of an alert reader parallel questions that modern moral philosophy does not ask often enough: where does our own ethical theory fit in the real lives of ordinary non-specialists? What is the use of ethical theory, and how do we bring it to bear on the people who, one supposes, are the intended beneficiaries of our philosophy? There is, of course, much more of this kind of thinking in the ancient world, in writers like Cicero, Seneca, Plutarch, and Lucian. Although an essay on Horace seems at first sight to be an anomaly in a Companion to Ancient Ethics, it in fact provides an important perspective on issues that continue to matter deeply to moral philosophers.

This is a rich and stimulating collection covering many central aspects of ancient ethics and, at its best, connecting ancient themes with modern preoccupations in a thought-provoking, non-dogmatic way. It widens the usual range of figures and topics covered, admirably well for a book of this size. Specialists and novices alike are in good hands with this Companion.