The Cambridge Companion to Ancient Greek Political Thought

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Stephen Salkever (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Ancient Greek Political Thought, Cambridge UP, 2009, 380pp, $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521687126.

Reviewed by Steven Skultety, University of Mississippi-Oxford



I. Demands of the Genre

Whatever the mundane marketing motivation for selling anthologies through the curious platform of “companions,” “guidebooks,” and “handbooks,” it is fairly clear that there are two extraordinary pressures exerted on someone who has been asked to edit A Companion to Hume rather than Essays on Hume, or the scholar who finds herself editing The Handbook to Thucydides instead of Thucydides: a New Anthology. First, a companion book suggests that it will be accessible to non-experts, and will be able to serve as something of a literature review for those who know a bit about the primary material, but less about technical research. Second, a guidebook promises to have scholars stepping back from the daily thrusts and parries of debatable minutiae, and identifying what they take to be the big themes and the key ideas that frame their field. Thus, beneath the innocuous words “handbook” or “companion” lurks the rather daunting assumption that the editor will do his or her best to articulate what is truly memorable in this generation’s contribution to the history of thought.

Keeping these two demands of the companion genre in mind, readers of NDPR should appreciate the unusually difficult challenge Stephen Salkever faced in agreeing to edit The Cambridge Companion to Ancient Greek Political Thought. Here is an attempt to give a scholarly overview of thinking (not just philosophy) about politics all the way from Homeric Greece to the Stoicism of Rome, covering well over 1000 years of intellectual history. Taking on such a project is obviously going to require an unusually large number of painful tradeoffs and unfortunate omissions. Moreover, unlike editors of many other companions, Salkever is probably facing a greater than normal degree of skepticism about the importance of this material. After all, few philosophers or political scientists are interested in political thought that pre-dates Hobbes, and while those of a literary or historical bent may find the classical world interesting, many may doubt the wisdom of focusing only on politics.

In spite of these challenges, I believe Salkever has done scholars of ancient political thought proud in assembling the essays that make up this particular volume. Even though I cannot say that I ultimately agree with all his decisions about which trade-offs to make and which enduring themes to emphasize, this is still a really good book. As stand-alone essays, all twelve contributions are worth the reader’s effort, and, taken together, they leave the reader with the distinct impression that ancient political thought is a neglected treasure-trove for future work. Ignored by modernists, abused by anti-modernists, neglected by ethicists, and misconceived by political scientists, the reader comes away rooting for ancient politics as a kind of underdog of the humanities.

II. The Intent of the Book

Admirably, Salkever uses the Introduction to come right out and announce what he takes to be the most important contribution this generation of scholars is making to the study of ancient political thought. I think it best to see his position as having two components. The first might be called the “methodological” element. Leading scholars of ancient political thought are comprised of people who are (a) interdisciplinary rather than isolated by modern academic partitions, (b) relevant to contemporary democratic thought rather than romantic or antiquarian, and © historically informed rather than ahistorical or historicist. Study of ancient politics is best handled by those who are able to do all three.

I’m certainly sympathetic, and who could fault Salkever for eschewing dogmatic use of the ancients with respect to discipline, quixotic political goals, or blinkered meta-history? Nevertheless, a purely methodological characterization of the field would be problematic: if scholars of ancient thought are characterized by their approach rather than any particular content, why, exactly, should anyone want to study ancient Greek political thought? Even if this anti-dogmatic approach is itself inspired by the ancients, we need to know why someone should not simply take this method and use it to investigate the thought of some other time and place.

Salkever does not explicitly acknowledge this worry — but I would guess that some version of the problem explains why Salkever also posits that a democratic theme underlies this anthology:

All of the chapters in this volume are characterized by a present and future-oriented — though historically informed — interpretation of Greek political thought. One proposition runs through all the chapters: the texts and practices of ancient Greece can provide contributions to modern democratic discussion that are otherwise unavailable. (2)

This is not a repetition of the methodological point: the study of ancient Greece offers something for modern democratic thought that simply cannot be offered by studying other subject matter. But this claim raises its own set of questions. What is the nature of this unique contribution? And what is the modern democratic discussion to which it can contribute?

For answers let us turn to the collection of essays.

III. Four Ways of Thinking about Politics

The book begins with five chapters on figures that are typically neglected by political philosophy (Homer, Aeschylus and Sophocles, Herodotus and Thucydides), then has three chapters on Platonic dialogues, two chapters on Aristotle, and, finally, three chapters on the broad themes of virtue politics, individual rights, and natural law. This sequential order, however, covers over what I see as four rather distinct conceptions of political thought being worked out by the various contributors.

First, four of the essays advocate politics as anti-theory and indeterminacy. Indeed, these authors make a point of distancing themselves from “systematic” or “synoptic” philosophers, celebrating politics as a kind of never-ending refutation to that sort of approach. In “Foundings vs. Constitutions: Ancient Tragedy and the Origins of Political Community” Arlene Saxonhouse argues that the tragedies of Aschylus and Sophocles portray the catastrophic demise of individuals who vastly overestimate the power of intellect in establishing political orders. For Gerald Mara, in “Thucydides and Political Thought,” Thucydides is only systematic in the way he shows figure after figure trying to impose a conceptual order on events, only to be undercut by other characters, conflicts, and events. In “‘This Way of Life, This Contest’: Rethinking Socratic Citizenship” Susan Bickford ponders how Socrates can define politics as the ability to persuade, call himself the greatest politician of Athens, and then fail to persuade anyone. Her answer is to see Socrates as someone who habitually demands knowledge of issues he takes to be unknowable, and who is thus less of a philosopher advancing arguments, and more of a special citizen possessed with the ability to inspire peers without a promise of final answers. Salkever’s own "Reading Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics and Politics as a Single Course of Lectures: Rhetoric, Politics, and Philosophy" advances the idea that Aristotelian politikē (the overarching discipline within which Aristotle places ethics, political science, and even social science) is really the recommendation of the open-ended practice of questioning rather than any kind of theory.

This group of essays sits in some tension, then, with four essays that seem to flirt with exactly the kind of philosophical and theory-laden approach to politics that the anti-theorists attack. Fred Miller, Jr. outlines reasons for believing that some version of a rights theory (though admittedly not a modern version which stresses absolute commitments to persons) can be found in ancient thought in “Origins of Rights in Ancient Political Thought.” While he thinks it is too far a stretch to attribute rights to Platonic political thought, Miller argues that rights gain an ever-increasing foothold in political thinking from Aristotle onward, and perhaps had its seeds all along in the rare and severely muted — but nevertheless existent — ancient objection to slavery. Eric Brown, in “The Emergence of Natural Law and the Cosmopolis,” documents the emergence of Stoic political thought from its Heraclitean and Socratic roots. For its critics, both the idea that the standard for right and wrong was a transcendent “law”, and the notion that all rational beings formed a cosmic community remained sketchy metaphors. The Stoics, however, in spite of such critics, pressed ahead to try and make these principles central to a metaphysically rich and psychologically nuanced political theory.

"The Political Drama of Plato’s Republic" by David Roochnik begins by setting out the various components of Plato’s harsh appraisal of democracy, but concludes by listing all the ways that Plato seems to qualify this very critique. Because of this conceptual conflict, Roochnik ends his essay by claiming that the Republic isn’t a political theory but a political drama — and this might suggest that his essay should be grouped with the anti-theorists. But the general point of the article is not that Plato has deliberately created a conflict to undermine theory per se, but rather that his attitude toward democracy is quite nuanced and perhaps even conflicted. Similarly, Catherine Zuckert’s “Practical Plato” is a commentary on the Statesman that brings out its “paradoxical” quality — by this she does not mean outright contradiction, or a move against the theoretical, but the claim that no true statesman would ever agree to the conditions imposed on all actual statesmen.

In contrast to these essays that ground politics in (perhaps hidden or paradoxical) principles, the remaining essays want to drop universal codes, but without abandoning theory altogether. We might think of these as offering non-standard or alternative theories of politics. First, there are three essays that ground political thought in virtue and character rather than abstract rules or laws. Norma Thompson’s “Favored Status in Herodotus and Thucydides: Recasting the Athenian Tyrannicides Through Solon and Pericles” attempts to show that these two great historians advocate for the political ideals of self-rule and anti-tyranny by embracing Solon and Pericles as alter-egos whose favored status pulls in the reader to experience their plight. Jill Frank and S. Sara Monoson emphasize character and virtue to account for the discrepancy between the depiction of Theramenes given by Aristotle and that of nearly all other ancient writers who mention him. "Lived Excellence in Aristotle’s Constitution of Athens: Why the Encomium of Theramenes Matters" argues that Aristotle offers a poetic history, designed to teach readers that both democrats and oligarchs — whose partisan political positions are defined by rigid principle — are inferior to someone like Theramenes who acts virtuously for the common good regardless of which side this favors, and who sticks up for lawfulness in general rather than any narrow conception of abstract law. Finally, explicitly addressing modern liberal democrats who are sympathetic to virtue theory, Ryan Balot uses “The Virtue Politics of Democratic Athens” to argue that they would do well to turn away from Aristotle, whose political theory is hopelessly elitist and tends to inspire republicanism, and instead look to the virtue theory embodied in the speeches given by orators of democratic Athens. This Athenian version of virtue ethics, which he argues is radically individualistic and non-hierarchical, offers a unique blend of virtue and individual freedom that will help to combat the assumption that virtue politics is overly paternalistic.

The fourth and final type of political conception is another alternative to principle-based theory. In the course of rescuing Homer from the gloss of being a collector of irrational stories, Dean Hammer, in “Homer and Political Thought,” does not ask that we reject political theory, but urges that we change the unit of political analysis from static structures to what he calls “fields.” The identity conditions of these fields are not arbitrary, but they are constituted by highly contingent inter-personal relations: like battlefields in a military context, different fields come into and leave existence as the tensions, resolutions, and tactical and strategic norms shift with the cast of participants and their vis-à-vis positions. Once politics is reconceived in this way, Homer is exposed as a rather rich and subtle political thinker, delicately tracking the emergent collisions and incorporations that made up early Greek community.

IV Trade-Offs

With these four models of politics in mind, what should we make of the claim that ancient Greek political thought has a unique contribution to make to modern democratic discussions? Much will depend, I suppose, on what we mean by “democracy.”

Of course there are a number of democratic theorists of whom we might avail ourselves for the sake of establishing such a meaning. But, staying within the contours of this particular anthology, one recurrent suggestion seems to be that we should use the word psychologically: in contrast to those who are dogmatic and intolerant, democracy picks out a group of people who are open-minded, ready for the future, sensitive to the precariousness of things, and tolerant enough to engage in far-reaching dialog with others. If that is the meaning, then it looks like the anti-theorists and virtue theorists of this anthology become clear-cut contributors to democracy, uncovering and articulating some of its first expressions in western literature. Unfortunately, however, if these essays are supposed to be making that sort of contribution, I fear that readers will be left a bit disappointed or confused. First, why won’t the essays that discuss principle-based theories of politics be sidelined as anti-democratic? Second, we seem to run into another version of the problem I mentioned above: if democracy is an attitude or approach, we need reasons to think that the ancient Greek version of it is particularly important and compelling — reasons this Companion does not articulate.

Another option sometimes suggested in this Companion is that “democracy” refers to the set of policies and values held by the “Left” in North America at the beginning of the 21st century. In that case, those who are for democracy would be contrasted with those (by definition) against democracy on the “Right”, including republicans (from whom Balot clearly wants to distance the field), and communitarians (from whom Salkever is trying to save the ancients). The benefit here would be that scholars of ancient thought would potentially be doing something more than producing arcane scholarship: their work could be making a contribution to democracy by providing ammunition and support to an actual living, breathing, political movement involved in important struggles. But if the intent of this Companion was to show that scholars of ancient Greek politics are making that sort of democratic contribution, far more work would be needed to go into helping readers reach that conclusion. After all, modern parties are often positioning themselves to take control of a nation, through representative mechanisms, on the basis of attitudes toward the State and market. Why, then, doesn’t this Companion help the reader to find analogs of party, nation, representation, state, and market in the ancient world? Again: it is one thing to point out that ancient democrats resemble contemporary democrats in this or that respect; but it is clearly something different to show that, on balance, there are enough reasons to make this comparison fruitful, and that, on the whole, the subject matter of ancient Greek political thought provides more help to the “Left” than the “Right.”

But isn’t there another meaning of the word “democracy” that deserves extended discussion in an anthology devoted to ancient Greek political thought? What about using that term to pick out a species of constitution to be distinguished from, say, oligarchy, aristocracy, tyranny, monarchy, and polity? What do the four models of ancient politics found in this volume contribute to the discussion about democracy in this constitutional sense? Surprisingly, the answer isn’t at all clear — and this, to my mind, is far and away the most astonishing feature of the volume. Though Roochnik’s and Balot’s pieces touch upon it, none of the essays offers a sustained analysis of democracy — modern or ancient — as one way of organizing a polis or community. Moreover, this neglect of constitutional democracy is but a symptom of the fact that the topics of constitutions and cities are more or less ignored. The relation of city and constitution, the elaborate ancient taxonomies of single-principle constitutions, the nascent notion of mixed government, the theories of why and how constitutions change — none of that makes it into this volume.

Now, as I said earlier, the terrain to be covered in this collection is so vast that, inevitably, any editor would be forced to make controversial decisions about which big topics to neglect. For example, I personally would have included an essay on Plato’s Laws. And since Herodotus made it in, I don’t know why Xenophon, Isocrates, and Polybius should be skipped. Yet these sorts of disagreements do not even rise to the level of criticism: such omissions are the result of reasonable judgment calls. On the other hand, leaving out extended discussions of what many readers would consider the most overtly political (polis-ical) topics in ancient political thought seems to deserve criticism.

V. Conclusion

Or does it? One of the most fascinating aspects of ancient Greek political thought is the plight of the delimited polis. It is astonishing that in studying this material one has the opportunity to go from reading about thoughtful people who are living in, identifying with, and dying for tiny outposts of humanity no bigger than many modern neighborhoods, all the way to Stoic philosophers who are advancing a conception of politics that calls into question whether any polis anywhere could be an appropriate source of attachment and identification.

In summarizing his description of model scholars, Salkever writes that

Another way of characterizing this recent tendency of studies in Greek political theory is to say that they have aimed at broadening the ‘modern political imaginary’ (Charles Taylor’s phrase), our sense of what is politically normal and possible (3).

At that point in the Introduction, he turns to advertise what I have called the “anti-theory” approach to politics. But another aspect of what he may have in mind is that his model scholar is someone who is either inspired by, or resigned to, a Roman or a post-Roman “imaginary” that is thoroughly cosmopolitan. For if one has transcended any and every particular polis as such in favor of the cosmopolis, then it seems perfectly reasonable that one would also downplay the conceptual machinery of the polis in one’s accounting of ancient Greek political thought. What I called a defect in the last section could actually turn out to be a triumph of historical sensitivity.

Of course, if that’s correct, then it will turn out that this anthology has yet another truly remarkable feature: not only is it a great read in itself, but it’s also a terrific advertisement for The Cambridge Companion to Ancient Roman Political Thought.