The Cambridge Companion to Ancient Scepticism

Placeholder book cover

Richard Bett (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Ancient Scepticism, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 380pp., $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521697545.

Reviewed by Harold Tarrant, University of Newcastle, Australia


Cambridge Companions presumably target readers who feel they need to understand the designated area better, and achieve a good overall grasp of it. With the normal reservations expected of a sceptic, I would happily class myself among them. The volume was useful to me, and will be useful to others.

The evidence for ancient scepticism is lamentably thin and difficult, partly because of the reluctance of Pyrrho, Arcesilaus, and Carneades to commit their philosophies to writing, partly because of the loss of anything substantial from Aenesidemus, and partly because of the reluctance of sceptics to openly embrace the positions that one feels they somehow held. Sextus Empiricus was a great system-reporter, and no doubt a good philosopher in his own right, but there are questions about his originality and about his having any historically motivated intentions. Pyrrhonists had problems with history, not least as it applied to their shadowy 'founder' himself.

Once the scope of the book is explained as being the scepticism of the ancient Mediterranean world, neither wholly Greek, nor Graeco-Roman, but certainly western, the topics covered seem entirely appropriate. There are six essays covering the origins and development of ancient scepticism from the Presocratics to Sextus (and in some cases beyond), seven on particular topics, and two that may be described as 'reception'. The overall standard of scholarship and the clarity of exposition are high.

Mi-Kyoung Lee begins with the antecedents of ancient scepticism, covering such topics as the difficulties in determining the nature of things, the variability of appearances, flux, relativism, indeterminacy, and contradictionism from the Milesians to Plato's contemporaries (e.g., Anaxarchus). There is discussion of such figures as Heraclitus, Xenophanes, Protagoras, Democritus, and Cratylus. Arguments both for and against sceptical positions are set out, in the latter case bringing one down to Aristotle. The conclusion suggests that nobody had yet wholeheartedly embraced the position that nothing may be known, nor encouraged systematic suspension of judgment, whereas some would do so in the Hellenistic period. Given the early topic, Lee (27-8) may perhaps be forgiven for talking of '"scepticism," as that term was later used in the Hellenistic period.' My conclusion had been that no such term had been used in the required sense during the Hellenistic period (as usually defined: 323-146BCE), and if I was wrong I should prefer to have the evidence. The fact is that Academic Sceptics embraced no '-ism' and knew themselves only as Academics. I was also perplexed by the idea that Pyrrho 'came from the same geographical area' as Democritus and Anaxarchus (25). It is his eastern travels, not his city, that link Pyrrho with Anaxarchus. None of this detracts from the appropriateness of the philosophic material.

Svavar Hrafn Svarvarsson continues with a chapter on the enigmatic Pyrrho and his admirer Timon. The later Pyrrhonists of course suspended judgment about the nature of the philosophy that Pyrrho practised, the only Greek philosophic movement to acknowledge so tenuous a commitment to its founder. However, it remains appropriate to discuss the philosophic position that can most plausibly be attributed to Pyrrho, and this Svarvarsson does with some deft discussion of the most important (but fourth-hand) evidence from Eusebius via Aristocles and Timon (41-50). I wondered in this context whether the natural concern of philosophers with true and false statements had not entailed a less-than-full discussion of the key verbs alêtheuein and pseudesthai, which I should see as meaning something like 'try to convey the truth' and 'try to convey a falsehood' rather than just 'tell the truth' and 'lie', fleshing out the popular connection with honesty and deceit.

A chapter on the New Academics Arcesilaus and Carneades, which some editors would have split between two chapters, is given to Harald Thorsrud, who does well to compress some critical debates into a short space. On the question of why Arcesilaus concentrated his attack on Zeno of Citium's epistemology (62-3), I felt that too little is made of the fact that both studied in the Academy under Polemo. Zeno's misapplication of anything that he had learned from Socrates, Plato, or Polemo himself could have incited Arcesilaus to bring all his weapons to bear against him. While Polemo showed no signs of being an epistemologist, his colleague (and Arcesilaus' close friend) Crantor explains the Timaeus' World-Soul in epistemological terms, and may very well have written a primitive commentary on the Theaetetus, as I shall argue elsewhere. The extensive material on Pyrrho in the partly extant papyrus ­Theaetetus-commentary may even derive from Crantor rather than Aenesidemus as I previously supposed. This would give a different twist to the evidence concerning Arcesilaus' much-debated connection with the otherwise unlikely figure of Pyrrho (62): might he have derived it from his friend's picture of Pyrrho's epistemology, divorced from any hint of Pyrrhonist ethics? The anti-Stoic epistemological arguments are well discussed, as is the theory of action according to what is reasonable. Thorsrud finds little commitment on Arcesilaus' part, but some very effective arguments and strategies.

Less than half the chapter is allocated to Carneades, with an emphasis on his new and more complex practical criterion and on the question of whether he adhered to a strictly dialectical or to a fallibilist kind of scepticism. Thorsrud concludes that he is a fallibilist in his acceptance of opinions in the ordinary man, but dialectical in his rejection of them as they are defined by the Stoics -- which sounds to me almost too like a 'common-sense' position and insufficient to explain the hostility of Antiochus of Ascalon and others. Even so, given that his own pupils were unable to say for certain exactly which positions Carneades favoured himself, Antiochus could hardly have known that Carneades held such an opinion, nor indeed can we. It is an appropriate philosophical exercise to ask what position we might charitably attribute to Carneades, given what we know of his strategies, but the historical truth was probably irrecoverable even in Cicero's time.

Carlos Lévy contributes an excellent chapter on 'The sceptical Academy: decline and afterlife', an area for which there is much more evidence. Decline involves the pupils of Carneades, Philo of Larissa, and his rebellious pupil Antiochus. The 'afterlife' takes in Aenesidemus, Middle Platonism, Augustine, and Petrus Valentia: an interesting figure new to me.

In establishing that Metrodorus of Stratonicea 'was a loner' (84), Lévy's text refers to 'a passage of Cicero's De Oratore, in which the orator [L. Licinius] Crassus reports that at the time of his trip to Athens, in 100 BCE, the school was run by Charmadas, Clitomachus, and Aeschines.' Presumably this is a misprint for 110 BCE, for this was Clitomachus' final year, though Lévy does add that this raises 'rather important problems about the history of the institution'. I hope that he is alluding to the implication that there was not just a single scholarch at the forefront, but (as in the days of Polemo, Crates, Crantor, and the young Arcesilaus) at least two senior figures, either of whom might also have a favoured understudy destined to succeed him. Arcesilaus had thus been destined to succeed Crantor, whose works he apparently revised; but since Crates died soon after Polemo, he had not yet adequately prepared Socratides as his successor, and therefore Arcesilaus may have combined both offices. His own successor Lacydes then handed his duties on to two successors, Telecles and Evander, as reported by Diogenes Laertius (4.60). Evander was clearly scholarch, as it was his office that was passed down to Carneades eventually. I would judge the title of the other office to be 'possessor of the books' to judge from Diogenes (3.66, 4.32), for scholarchs are not usually seen engaged in the editing, dissemination, interpretation, or teaching of Plato's works (as were Philip of Opus, Hermodorus, Crantor, and finally Charmadas). Scholarchs were the public figures, and thus had responsibility for any public stance of the school; but the De Oratore makes Charmadas' importance clear by naming him first at 1.45 and affirming (1.47) that it was with him that Crassus had read Plato's Gorgias.

Where Lévy finds it odd that Favorinus should have wanted to reconcile Academics and Pyrrhonists after Aenesidemus had been so hostile to the Academy (97), I suspect it is merely a matter of which Academics they are targeting. Aenesidemus had recent developments in mind, whereas Favorinus was thinking of a more robust Academic scepticism. Where it is observed that Augustine puzzled over the Academic pessimism about achieving the truth when coupled with a promise of wisdom (99), one might perhaps have noted that the similar contrast in the Theaetetus -- between Socrates' sterility (plus the failure to explain how knowledge could arise) and the wisdom at 176c4-5 (the very goal of Platonic philosophy).

R.J. Hankinson contributes a brief chapter on Aenesidemus, passing through the structure of his thought (with some emphasis on Photius and Aristocles) to the evidence in Sextus (and the difficulties of assessing where Sextus continues to follow the re-founder of Pyrrhonism) to the thorny problem of Aenesidemus in Heraclitean mode. It is important here that Hankinson does not take these references to reflect Aenesidemus' own philosophy. It seems probable to me that Aenesidemus had either employed Heraclitus as a character (but not a spokesman) in a dialogue or explained Heraclitean philosophy as a pre-Pyrrhonist attempt to wrestle with the equipollence of contrasting impressions.

Pierre Pellegrin takes the topic of Sextus Empiricus. He puts into perspective the general confusion about how one should view his works (seemingly more than two separate enterprises) and tackles the problems besetting those who would like to know more about his life, place in the movement's history, and personal contribution. It is interesting that after two previous accounts of Aenesidemus, both of which see him as launching a substantially new kind of scepticism, it is only here that we meet the ancient tradition that Aenesidemus had had at least two later-Pyrrhonist predecessors (Ptolemy of Cyrene and Heraclides). I find it gratifying that Pellegrin sees fit to give here some account of the terms skepsis, 'sceptic', and 'dogmatic' in Sextus; however, readers should beware of reading exactly these senses into earlier debate. What he leaves to others is the important question of Sextus', and more broadly Pyrrhonists', relations to the Empiric medical sect, though he does highlight (133-4) his recognition of an affinity with the Methodist school. For Pellegrin the mature Sextus is a sceptic 'fundamentalist', who will 'take extraordinary precautions to prevent dogmatism from sneaking into sceptical discourse' (128). Pellegrin adheres to the new chronology of Sextus' works, whereby M7-11 is an earlier work 'put together from course notes, teacherly and a bit repetitive', while PH1-3 is 'an incisive, terse summary written later' (136-7). Somewhat different conditions are held to apply in the case of M1-6, which are not directly tackling philosophy, so that Pellegrin thinks it possible that M7-10 (sic, 138) was its sequel.

Part two begins with Casey Perin on 'Scepticism and belief'. The essay would have benefited from a discussion of the semantic range of those Greek terms that are sometimes translated 'belief', none of which corresponds very closely to our term. On Arcesilaus we begin with Cicero's report at Acad. 1.45. The reason for doing so would be stronger if one took into account who is speaking at a given point, noting that this is Cicero in propria persona. It is also at the beginning of this version of the Academica and might be expected to offer a simplified position. Then Michael Frede's sophisticated distinction between weak and strong assent becomes more useful than Perin allows (149). I cannot understand the criticism of Frede for failing to account for his use of 'acceptance' in the strong sense as a synonym for belief, since the whole Stoic theory to which Arcesilaus responds works in terms of assent rather than belief anyway. Perin prefers a distinction between assenting and hypothesizing (or approving), appealing to Acad. 2.104 (Clitomachus), but without any consideration of the Latin terms and their natural meaning (let alone the Greek originals). I cannot see how Arcesilaus' need for an appropriate response to presentations for practical epistemology and action could have been well served by adopting mere hypotheses. Fortunately we move quickly to Sextus, where the dispute with Frede is more plausibly continued, showing first how PH1.27 would probably view even a non-dogmatic belief as potentially disturbing. Frede's distinction is replaced by one that distinguishes beliefs about how things are from those about how things seem. Perin closes by putting the most emphasis on the pathê as a source of something akin to belief for the sceptic.

Katja Maria Vogt tackles 'Scepticism and action' methodically, bringing a good background in Stoicism to bear on the Academics (briefly) and then on Sextus. There is potentially a fair bit of overlap with earlier chapters, but this new investigation is by no means redundant.

In an illuminating chapter Richard Bett moves to 'Scepticism and ethics', drawing primarily on Against the Ethicists(=M11) and the relevant portion of PH3. Apart from the portion designed to question the existence of any ethical technê, these texts, it is pointed out, do not follow entirely the same pattern, nor the expected one. For the argument against things being by nature good or bad tends to be carried on by simply pointing out the disagreements about which things are which, though this somehow relates in PH3 to the principle that if x is F by nature, x must affect us all similarly (in respect of F-ness). M11 concludes simply that nothing is good or bad by nature (which sounds too like a doctrine), not that we should suspend judgment on this issue. Bett associates this book closely with an Aenesideman source. Various accounts of the Pyrrhonist goal are considered, and finally there are a few words on Academic ethics.

Gisela Striker, in writing on 'Academics versus Pyrrhonists, reconsidered', again seems primarily concerned with action and with the Pyrrhonist goal of tranquility. However, this results in a reconsideration of PH1.228-30 in a way that sharply differentiates the Academics' non-dogmatic assent to something plausible from the Pyrrhonists' passive yielding to the impression. Striker concludes that the Pyrrhonists have, unlike Academics, abandoned philosophic judgments, only to be forced back into philosophizing in order to defend their own position.

Paul Woodruff's chapter on 'The Pyrrhonist Modes' is in important inclusion, but seems content with playing a rather didactic role. Hence it is surprisingly conclusion-free.

James Allen then tackles 'Pyrrhonism and medicine', in particular the surprising relationship between the Pyrrhonists and Empiric medical theory, and also Sextus' praise of the Methodists. He suggests that 'Methodism appeals to Sextus because it had a more generous conception of the phenomena and the reasoning that is possible on their basis' (244). It does not, however, solve the problem of why he and his pupil are known as Empiricists. Perhaps it was possible to view Methodism as an offshoot or correction of Empiricism, or perhaps Sextus the medical practitioner spoke with a rather different voice from Sextus the Pyrrhonist. I for one would not wish to be treated by too rigorous a Pyrrhonist physician.

Emidio Spinelli tackles 'Pyrrhonism and the specialized sciences', on M1-6. He takes these books to follow M7-11 and finds in them a fairly traditional Pyrrhonism, one that does not go to rustic extremes.

Luciano Floridi writes on 'The rediscovery and posthumous influence of scepticism', bringing us up to the Renaissance. Michael Williams concludes with 'Descartes' transformation of the sceptical tradition', a chapter replete with valuable comparative material. These chapters on the reception of scepticism conclude and flesh out a useful and user-friendly companion to one of antiquity's more important philosophies: if, that is, it was ever one philosophy, and if it was really a philosophy at all.