The Cambridge Companion to Anselm

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Brian Davies and Brian Leftow (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Anselm, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 248pp, $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521002052.

Reviewed by David Luscombe, University of Sheffield


The series of volumes of Cambridge Companions to major philosophers is well established and the present volume is a welcome addition. Companions to medieval philosophers already published include volumes for Abelard, Aquinas, Duns Scotus, and Ockham -- four "mountain peaks" -- so one for Anselm of Bec and Canterbury is certainly due. The series also includes two volumes of a more general kind, one on Medieval Jewish philosophy, and another on Medieval Philosophy in general. Others on medieval Arab and Byzantine philosophy would be welcome, and there remain other thinkers from Eriugena to Cusanus to tempt the publisher as well as future editors.

Apart from the Introduction, written by the two editors of this volume, there are twelve chapters by as many contributors. All are of a high standard and they cover the main aspects of Anselm's contributions to thought. This is less of an anodyne remark than it may appear, for many students of Anselm will know only a few aspects, typically his "ontological argument" in favour of God's existence and his "satisfaction theory" of the atonement or the redemption. But this volume pushes the boundaries wider by including chapters on the philosophy of language, on modality, freedom, Platonism and ethics -- topics that have, by and large, received less attention in other recent general studies such as those written by G.R. Evans, Jasper Hopkins, and R.W. Southern. The editors, in their Introduction, justly begin with the remark that Anselm is "at once one of the best- and least-known" of medieval thinkers and they declare their purpose to introduce readers "to the range of Anselm's thinking" (p. 1), on which students and general readers have hitherto been able to find little reading -- little reading, that is, of the secondary kind, for Brian Davies modestly omits to mention that his publication (with G.R. Evans) of Anselm of Canterbury: The Major Works in the Oxford World Classics series in 1998 placed a wide range of Anselm's writing in translation at the disposal of the general reader and inexpensively.

G.R. Evans introduces Anselm -- his life, his works and his influence until the fourteenth century. She draws attention to the meticulous care that Anselm devoted to what he wrote and to how it was copied, and also to the range of his works which include, beside the Monologion and Proslogion, a group of dialogues (On Truth, On Freedom of Choice, On the Fall of the Devil and On the Grammarian), and other works On the Virgin Conception and Original Sin, Why God became Man, On the Incarnation of the Word, On the Procession of the Holy Spirit, On Concord and, not least, the important "philosophical fragments."

M. McCord Adams, in her chapter on the relationship between faith and reason, notes the difference between contemporary philosophers who seek reasons that are acceptable to unbelievers and the eleventh-century situation in which monks sought deeper understanding of their beliefs. (While this seems broadly true, there is a puzzling suggestion on p. 32 that Anselm may eventually have been confronted with "real non-Christians"). She focuses on the nature of such an inquiry which is both intellectual and emotional, and requires collaboration between man and God, prayer, and reliance on various kinds of authority. G.B. Matthews considers Anselm's use of Augustine and Plato. Anselm famously cited sources rarely and there has developed in recent years something of a cottage industry intent on finding passages in Augustine's works on which he relied as well as stylistic similarities. Book 2 of Augustine's On Free Choice is an acknowledged source for Anselm's argument for God's existence as well as for Anselm's enquiry into the problem of the relationship between divine foreknowledge and human free will. Anselm also made much use of Augustine's On the Trinity. Plato has been and remains more difficult to find since the source, often enough Augustine, is always indirect.

Peter King, writing on philosophy of language, makes very clear the large extent to which Anselm discusses semantic issues, especially signification and appellation. Anselm has little to say about predication (although, as Knuuttila points out in the next chapter (p. 124), Anselm planned to write about it) but quite a lot to say about how to understand privative, infinite, and empty words (examples, respectively, are 'evil,' 'nonhuman,' and 'nothing'). Anselm also has much to say about truth in statements, thoughts, volitions, senses, actions, beings, and God. King deals with truth in statements. Simo Knuuttila writes on Anselm's use of basic modal terms (necessity, possibility, impossibility) in the light of the traditions familiar to Anselm and stemming from Boethius and Augustine. For Anselm nothing is necessary or impossible without God willing it to be so; but it is not true that God wills or does not will something because of a necessity or an impossibility.

Brian Leftow writes about Anselm's ideas of perfect being and also relates these to what Anselm found in Boethius and Augustine. In the Monologion Anselm identifies attributes which are perfections and tests a number of ways of formulating states which are superior or inferior to each other (e.g. just but not wise seems better than wise but not just). The formulation 'God alone is that than which there is nothing better' fails because what is best actually may not have all the perfections and may even have imperfections. Anselm rejected Gaunilo's criticism that he had argued for the existence of something which is, in fact, greater than everything else. In the Proslogion Anselm finds in favour of the best actual being being the best possible being in the best possible state. Leftow separates out and numbers the steps by which one argument form emerges and by which "compatibility problems" are solved (e.g. God is omnipotent but unable to sin). Brian Davies deals with the "ontological argument." He is concerned in particular with the possibility that a key proposition in Proslogion 2 about being in intellectu and being in re can be rendered into English in different ways and therefore the effort must be made to establish down which track Anselm actually went.

Sandra Visser and Thomas Williams write on freedom of choice which Anselm defined in a seemingly limited way as "the power to preserve rectitude of will for its own sake" or for the sake of justice. Anselm's account of freedom in his On Freedom of Choice, On Truth and On the Fall of the Devil sometimes admits a freedom to choose between alternative possibilities but still comes back to the view that freedom is not being able to do other than as one does because freedom is doing what one ought to do for the sake of salvation, and loss of freedom lies in doing what one ought not to do. Visser and Williams also write the chapter on truth and again find that, although Anselm has a common-sense view of truth (truth says of what is that it is, and of what is not that it is not), he sees truth as rectitude; and "getting things right" leads Anselm to the supreme Truth which is God.

Jeffrey Brower justly and importantly emphasises that it is an error to overlook Anselm's ethics, although the elements of this have to be picked out of his treatises and pieced together. Once more we find that this is centered on Anselm's thought about justice and rectitude. William Mann guides us through some parts of Anselm's presentation of the Trinity; he does, however, miss the chance to reflect on the serious challenge Anselm received from Roscelin over the incarnation. Finally, David Brown skillfully unpicks the complex arguments and the "necessary reasons" contained in Why God became Man. The Bibliography (9 pages) is a little economical -- for example only one of the three volumes of Frohlich's complete English version of Anselm's correspondence is listed.

The contributors all seem to have been asked to reconstruct critically the details of Anselm's arguments and to enumerate their different steps in tabular form. They have done this well. In total these essays provide the most comprehensive presentation of Anselm's philosophy that has yet been achieved in a single volume. They differ among themselves in the extent to which they evaluate Anselm in the light of his and his predecessors' reading of the works of Boethius and Augustine. How much, for example, did Anselm know about the "semi-pelagianism" that was so controversial in the fifth and sixth centuries, about Adoptianism, about the predestination controversy of the ninth century or about the different ways of interpreting the Categories that were being debated in the schools in his own day? But, although that too may be important (and remains difficult to consider), it is secondary in importance in this volume to the main task of unravelling the intricate threads of Anselm's tapestries and of testing their tautness.