The Cambridge Companion to Atheism

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Michael Martin (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Atheism, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 352pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521603676.

Reviewed by J. L. Schellenberg, Mount Saint Vincent University


This book is a reference work on atheism intended for students and nonspecialists. Its eighteen authors include eleven writers from philosophy, three from religious studies, and one each from sociology, anthropology, psychology, and law. Quite well organized, the book has three chapters on Background, nine on The Case Against Theism, and six on Implications. It is often interesting and stimulating, and contains a good deal of useful material. But its chapters are of uneven quality, and some will be tough going for beginners. The book also features some internal tensions (perhaps the inevitable result of such a diverse set of contributors). These tensions are not in themselves disturbing and could even be pedagogically useful. But they might have been acknowledged up front and better integrated into the overall flow of the book.

One of the questions that such a collection should obviously be expected to address is this: What is atheism? The editor, Michael Martin, tenders an irenic answer in his General Introduction: atheism can be positive (disbelief) or negative (the absence of belief), as well as narrow (disbelief or absence of belief specifically with respect to the personal God of traditional theism) or broad (disbelief or absence of belief with respect to all gods). This explication is not entirely unattractive. One remembers, for example, that A. C. Grayling, an atheist if ever there was one, is in his new book not just against the God of traditional theism but Against All Gods. But the idea of negative atheism is not easy to accept (at least for me). Martin says that in Greek a can be read as 'without' and theos means 'god', and hence there is linguistic warrant for thinking of atheists as those without a belief in gods. But his contributor on the Greek period (Jan M. Bremmer, 'Atheism in Antiquity') apparently disagrees, suggesting that one who was atheos would originally have been taken as being without gods or "godforsaken" (19), a notion that (as even the Psalmist knew) comports better with belief in the Divine than with nonbelief. And William Lane Craig ('Theistic Critiques of Atheism') points out that if simply the absence of belief in God makes one an atheist, then "even infants count as atheists" (70). Given such worries (and certain related ones I haven't space to point out), and because of the separate identity that another form of the 'absence of belief ' -- namely, agnosticism -- has in the last century clearly carved out for itself, it might have been better to stick with what Martin calls positive atheism, broad and narrow, in this volume.

One reason why some of the book's non-philosophical contributors might resist a more precise understanding of atheism is that social scientific surveys apparently do not accommodate it. Thus, guided by the questions on his questionnaires and in his studies, the sociologist Phil Zuckerman, in 'Atheism: Contemporary Numbers and Patterns' (like the psychologist Benjamin Beit-Hallahmi in 'Atheists: A Psychological Profile'), construes the relevant contrast as between those who do believe in God or a Higher Power and those who don't. This generates some interesting information: Zuckerman estimates that "between 500 million and 750 million humans currently do not believe in God" and concludes that such figures "render any suggestion that theism is innate or neurologically based manifestly untenable" (61). But it would be nice to have more discriminating information about those who -- statistics would probably show! -- are considered the real atheists by most of us: those who don't believe in God because they disbelieve.

Another, and related, conceptual question one might bring to this book -- one that is underlined by its cover image of NGC688, the Crescent Nebula -- concerns the relation between atheism and a scientifically-based naturalism. Does the former entail the latter? Nothing in Martin's definition suggests that it does, but again some of his contributors appear to have a different view. Jan Bremmer (mentioned above) and Gavin Hyman ('Atheism in Modern History') show that the use of 'atheism' to name a distinguishable intellectual position is linked to the development of naturalistic explanations both for religion and for what the religious take it to explain. (Later in the book, Daniel C. Dennett, in 'Atheism and Evolution', and also Stewart E. Guthrie, in 'Anthropological Theories of Religion', carry on this tradition of naturalistic explanation.) Hyman sees modern atheism as deeply implicated in a modern "desire for an all-encompassing mastery of reality by rational and/or scientific means" (28) -- indeed, he thinks of it as the culmination of such a perspective. But the perspective in question is a naturalistic one. Thus it appears that he at least would be inclined to defend the entailment in question. Likewise, John D. Caputo, in 'Atheism, A/theology, and the Postmodern Condition' (which is almost a companion piece to Hyman's: the two authors refer approvingly to one another and develop complementary ideas), assumes that today's atheism, like theism, has an "absolute center or unshakable foundation," which is more than once suggested to include "physics" (270). So perhaps Caputo would be prepared to join Hyman in the claim that atheism entails naturalism.

However, Michael Martin, in his piece 'Atheism and Religion', shows that the entailment in question clearly does not hold: atheists needn't accept naturalism and may indeed question or deny it, as religious atheists commonly do! (This isn't Martin's way of putting his point, but it follows from what he does say.) Martin's conclusion is that "certainly Jainism, probably Buddhism, and perhaps Confucianism are atheistic in the narrow sense" (230). Such traditions, he points out, even include arguments for positive atheism, some of them predating Western arguments of a similar form. (These arguments, it is worth noting, are not grounded in scientific naturalism.) It is easy for atheists -- caught up in a mentality suggested by Hyman and Caputo and also by Steven G. Gey, who in his 'Atheism and the Freedom of Religion' shows how easy it is where theism is dominant to think of atheists as seeking "freedom from religion" (257) -- to treat their rejection of a personal God as entailing a commitment to irreligion and naturalism. But Martin's essay should give them pause. It is just a fact that some well-known forms of religion are committed to transcendent realities while being completely uncommitted to a personal God or gods. Perhaps the religion of the future will, like them, do without gods altogether.

But even if positive atheism does not entail naturalism, the converse does hold, and perhaps atheism is the beneficiary. To Evan Fales, in 'Naturalism and Physicalism', falls the task of exploring this possibility. His main point, repeated in different contexts, is that we should reject the idea of disembodied minds. Fales tries to give scientific evidence in support of this view, but succeeds only in showing that mental states appear to depend on physical ones in human beings. Thus, even if support for a contrary view in the form of mystical or paranormal phenomena is, as he claims, unsuccessful, Fales' arguments leave one, at best, undecided about his naturalism (and the atheism it entails).

Let us set aside now all the questions about the definition of atheism and the possibility of defending it by reference to naturalism that have exercised us so far. Perhaps one can show, more straightforwardly, that traditional theism (belief in a personal God) is bankrupt and that there are good arguments for its denial (for what Martin would call narrow positive atheism -- what most of us mean by atheism). The heart of the book is given over to an attempt to establish both of these claims. It begins somewhat oddly with a theist's case against atheism -- Craig's essay, mentioned above. (I suppose the idea was to get a representative philosophical theism out in the open, so we know what the subsequent atheistic case is against.) Craig's reasoning is characteristically brisk and clear. He does sometimes try to take objections into account, as when discussing his well-known kalam cosmological argument. But he is also somewhat misleading and uncharitable at points, as when he dismisses the hiddenness argument for atheism as ignoring that what God wants is a love relationship, not just belief that he exists (71) -- in the process himself ignoring that the argument he rejects is grounded in points about love relationships, which certainly involve more than belief in the existence of the other, but just as certainly cannot get along without it. On evil, Craig gravely intones that we must not be overconfident about the ways of God (73), while brimming with confidence in his development of arguments for theism that require assumptions about the ways of God. On the moral argument we find this astounding claim: "In the absence of God it is difficult to see any reason to think that human beings are special" (82).

How well do atheists in this book answer theistic arguments like Craig's? The results are mixed. Craig-type points about morality of the sort just mentioned are dismantled by David O. Brink in his essay 'The Autonomy of Ethics'. (This paper is clear and authoritative, but it might have benefited from an explicit discussion of Robert Adams' revisions to the Divine Command Theory.) Richard M. Gale, in 'The Failure of Classical Theistic Arguments' (a piece more technical than many students will be able to bear), is effective in showing how the atheist can deal with the kalam argument. Keith Parsons ('Some Contemporary Theistic Arguments') deals quite accessibly with Craig's heroes: Plantinga and Swinburne. But some of what he says is misleading. Swinburne's case is not, as Parsons suggests, just a bunch of C-inductive (confirmatory) arguments leading to a P-inductive (probability) argument. Rather, there is at the end a crucial role for the evidence of religious experience, treated in a distinctive manner. And Parsons' comment that "Plantinga now holds that a belief is rational if and only if it is 'warranted'" (109) doesn't come close to doing justice to Plantinga's careful and discriminating discussion. He does have an interesting point (111) about how Plantinga's recent argument about warrant can be stood on its head (since naturalistic explanations show that religious beliefs lack warrant, it follows that there is no God), but he doesn't take on Plantinga's much-discussed evolutionary argument against naturalism (nor does Fales, assigned to discuss naturalism) -- which is obviously relevant to this line of reasoning.

Daniel Dennett's piece (mentioned above) brings up the rear in this book's presentation of the atheistic response to theistic arguments. He takes swipes at the design argument -- and much else -- with reasoning that will be familiar to those who know his Darwin's Dangerous Idea. Like many atheists, Dennett seems to fall for the 'who created God?' maneuver (143), which only shows the limited extent of his acquaintance with more sophisticated theistic work (e.g. that of Swinburne).

What about arguments directly for atheism? Here the reasoning of the book is, it seems to me, in even greater need of improvement. The problem of evil is surely one of the most important topics that a book on atheism can address in this connection, but Andrea M. Weisberger's chapter on the subject ('The Argument from Evil') unfortunately leaves much to be desired. Atheists will be surprised to learn that they are presenting "evidence against the existence of the traditional Western concept of God" (170, my emphasis). And then there is this sentence, featuring more than one confusion, which I will leave for the reader to untangle: "Plantinga claims that the nontheist must show that the claim 'there is unjustified evil in the world' is necessarily true since, he believes, such a statement is not essential to theism or a logical consequence of theistic belief" (167). The best that can be said about this paper is that Weisberger illustrates her points with vivid and detailed examples of actual suffering (more atheists should do so).

Quentin Smith follows Weisberger with a paper on 'Kalam Cosmological Arguments for Atheism'. (One wonders why Craig was not asked to reply to this reasoning in his own piece.) There is a lot of fairly sophisticated physics and philosophy here, which will make it interesting for philosophers but also inaccessible to an audience of "students and nonspecialists"; moreover, many of Smith's points are controversial even among atheists, and so make a dubious contribution to this part of the development of  'atheism's case against theism'. For example, according to Smith, we have an adequate explanation for the existence of the universe when we see that the "universe's existence is logically required by the existence of its parts" (193). But many will find this suggestion sophistical. We know that the existence of the universe has temporal parts, just as we know that the existence of a human being does. But we should not consider its existence explained by reference to them any more than we should consider the existence of a human being explained when we are reminded of its parts. Indeed, we have only arrived at the point of identifying what it is that is supposed to be explained!

It is left to Patrick Grim ('Impossibility Arguments') to salvage this perhaps not quite impossible mission of arguing for atheism. His essay provides a clear and fairly useful summary of the relevant arguments, but the discussion pro and con often leaves one with a sense of indecisiveness rather than the certainty of atheism's truth advertised by that word 'impossibility'. And some 'con' considerations are missed. For example, though it is good that Grim remembers (205) the different types of knowledge an omniscient being must possess (theistic philosophers often forget knowledge by acquaintance), he himself forgets the possibility of Divine imagination when arguing that God must, by virtue of lacking a body, be unable to 'know how' to do many things a human knows how to do (such as juggling). But the deeper problem here is that Grim's essay focuses, as most such discussions do, on logical puzzles in abstraction from the religious context which alone can make them relevant -- the idea of an ultimate personal being. Even if, for example, there are tasks (like that involving the wearisome stone) described with a limited human being in mind that God could not do precisely because God is not limited in the same ways, does this really prevent God from being unsurpassably great? (Grim comes to matters of moral perfection that are much more clearly religiously relevant in his final section, but here he is most brief.)

Perhaps the case for atheism can get some help from Christine Overall, whose paper 'Feminism and Religion' appears in another part of the book but nonetheless contains atheistic arguments. Overall raises many important points about women's oppression and shows how they can be added to the problem of evil, but it is not clear how considering it in this light makes the problem more severe than we already know it to be. Furthermore, she tends to conflate God and the traditions that believe in God, as in her comment about "a God who preaches women's inferiority" (246). It is important to note that what Overall here attributes to God is not at all entailed by her opening definition of God as "a personal being who is omniscient, omnipotent, and completely good and who created heaven and earth" (233). Indeed, unless we think that 'omnipotent' somehow entails 'relationally controlling' (it doesn't), such a being might well be the perfect feminist! And this suggests a perhaps more fruitful feminist angle: feminism allows us more clearly to see what an unsurpassably great personal being would be like, and makes the problem of evil more pressing for that reason -- for example, could a loving and empathetic feminist God really tolerate horrific suffering (whether experienced by women or not)? And perhaps a feminist God should be expected regularly to inform traditions believing in God of the anti-feminist errors of their ways (which have often enough become institutionally entrenched, sometimes thanks to what was perceived as a word from the Lord). Overall comes close to such points at times, but they are not clearly brought out.

I myself think that a good case for atheism (understood as disbelief of traditional theism) can be developed, but the arguments in this book leave one with the impression that the case is weaker than it is, and it must be said that the available arguments for theism are stronger than they are here suggested to be. Still, the student or nonspecialist will be able to take away from both the philosophical and the nonphilosophical discussions that this work contains a pretty good idea of which issues are important to the understanding and assessment of atheism, and should be stimulated -- if only through disagreement -- to think more carefully about those issues for herself.