The Cambridge Companion to Bertrand Russell

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Nicholas Griffin, ed., The Cambridge Companion to Bertrand Russell, Cambridge University Press, 2003, 568pp, $27.00 (pbk) ISBN 0521636345.

Reviewed by Arthur Sullivan, Memorial University of Newfoundland


This volume contains fifteen essays by well-established scholars addressed to various aspects of Russell’s wide-ranging and dynamic philosophical work. It also includes a fifty-page Introduction, in which the editor sketches Russell’s biography and surveys his philosophical development, and a fairly comprehensive Selective Bibliography, containing eight pages of works by Russell and twenty-five pages of works about Russell or his philosophy.

In general (and with considerable overlap) the fifteen papers might helpfully be divided into five categories. First, there are three essays on Russell’s formative influences and his relations to some important contemporaries—”Russell’s Philosophical Background” (Ch.2, by N. Griffin), “Russell and Moore” (Ch.3, by R. Cartwright), and “Russell and Frege” (Ch.4, by M. Beaney). Category two contains four essays addressed to Russell’s contributions to logic and the philosophy of mathematics—”Mathematics in and behind Russell’s Logicism” (Ch.1, by I. Grattan-Guinness), “Bertrand Russell’s Logicism” (Ch.5, by M. Godwyn & A.D. Irvine), “Russell’s Substitutional Theory” (Ch.7, by G. Landini), and “The Theory of Types” (Ch.8, by A. Urquhart). The third division consists of two essays exclusively addressed to the parts of Russell’s corpus that have become the most well-entrenched parts of the philosophical canon: namely, Russell’s philosophy of language and metaphysics in the first two decades of the twentieth century—”The Theory of Descriptions” (Ch.6, by P. Hylton), and “The Metaphysics of Logical Atomism” (Ch.11, by B. Linsky). (To be sure, though, this material is touched on, in less depth, in many other essays.) Category four contains two essays on Russell’s post-logical-atomist epistemology and metaphysics—”Russell’s Neutral Monism” (Ch.10, by R.E. Tully) and “Russell’s Structuralism and the Absolute Description of the World” (Ch.12, by W. Demopoulos). Finally, there are four retrospective overviews of some enduring aspects of Russell’s thought—”Russell’s Method of Analysis” (Ch.9, by P. Hager) is addressed to Russell’s philosophical methods, “From Knowledge by Acquaintance to Knowledge by Causation” (Ch.13, by T. Baldwin) discusses the development of Russell’s epistemology, “Russell, Experience, and the Roots of Science” (Ch.14, by A.C. Grayling) is addressed to Russell’s longstanding concern with explicating the relationship between sense experience and scientific knowledge, and “Bertrand Russell: Moral Philosopher or Unphilosophical Moralist?” (Ch.15, by C. Pigden) examines Russell’s contributions to moral philosophy.

Although I am tempted to enter into serious critical discussions with particular authors (which is itself a testament to how engaging and controversial Russell’s thought still is), I should not indulge this here, since the aim of this short review is to assess the volume as a whole. I set myself the more manageable aim of evaluating how well the volume measures up to two of its advertised goals: [1] for new readers, serving as the most convenient and accessible guide to Russell available, and [2] for specialists, serving as a conspectus of recent developments in Russell scholarship.

There is considerable overlap not only between the five categories I just listed, but also between the individual essays. This is practically unavoidable, and, to the extent that the essays are intended to be relatively freestanding resources, this is no defect. However, this does make for laborious reading, at parts, for the specialists and zealots who will read the volume cover-to-cover. (Regardless of the quality and subtlety of the expositions, encountering the third or fourth one-paragraph exposition of the theory of descriptions, or synopsis of the logicist thesis, is prone to cause flashbacks to grading papers.)

There are a number of dimensions along which the individual essays vary quite widely. Most importantly, they demand very different degrees of expertise on the part of the reader. For example, Landini’s essay on the substitutional theory—a pre-type-theoretic approach to the logical paradoxes that Russell developed from 1905-7—is not for the novice, being on a relatively inaccessible topic and unavoidably containing a lot of dated formalisms. Similarly for Demopoulus’ complex, advanced exposition of Russell’s structuralism—his view that we can only attain empirical knowledge of the structural aspects of physical entities, not of their intrinsic qualities. In contrast, Hylton’s essay on the theory of descriptions, for example, is not for the specialist, being a survey from a distance of some of the most well trodden terrain in analytic philosophy. A less important contrastive dimension is broadness vs. narrowness of topic (even setting aside the uniquely massive purview of Pidgen’s essay on all of Russell’s social and political writings). The essays by Grayling, Linksy, and Beaney, for example, discuss various strands of logic, language, epistemology, and metaphysics, whereas the essays by Urquhart and Godwyn & Irvine are sustained, focused discussions of narrower threads. Also, while some of the essays are more or less purely expository (such as those by Grattan-Guinness, Cartwright, Tully), others are arguments for controversial theses (Landini, Hager, Demopoulos, Pidgen).

No doubt, some will question the choice of selections. The editor (p.46) himself laments the volume’s relatively sketchy treatment of Russell’s later philosophy, for example, and those who are inclined to agree with Pidgen’s assessment that Russell is seriously underrated as a moral philosopher will feel that this aspect of Russell’s corpus has again been slighted. For my two bits, a piece explicitly tying Russell’s work to subsequent developments in the philosophy of language, or to the development of logical positivism, would be a welcome and worthwhile addition, as would a sustained discussion of the mutual influences between Russell’s and Wittgenstein’s philosophical work. One of the essays on logicism could probably have been sacrificed, cutting down on the overlap. (If this suggestion prompts a charge of heresy, for downplaying Russell’s contributions to logic and the philosophy of mathematics, I would plead that, while Russell’s version of logicism is historically monumental, the enduring intrinsic importance of the specific details might just warrant one essay, not two.) Also, Hager’s essay on Russell’s philosophical methods struck me as not terribly useful, for either of the volume’s intended audiences. (It is addressed to a topic that is not really on the novice’s agenda, and arguably does not command separate treatment, from the specialist’s point of view.) However, this is nitpicking—on the whole, these selections are well balanced. Griffin has done an admirable job with the daunting task of deciding what most merits attention, from Russell’s epic outpouring.

(Before I am done nitpicking, though, in the part of the Selective Bibliography addressed to work that draws on or develops Russell’s philosophy (pp.517-40), I find the selections to be capricious and sporadic. For example, some major recent discussants of Russell’s work in the philosophy of language—such as Donnellan, Kaplan, Kripke, Recanati, Salmon, and Soames—are not well represented, at the expense of much less influential work that includes the word ‘Russell’ in its title. However, again, given the sheer volume of work that the editor has to sift through and rank, for this task, it is hard to be all that critical. I submit that, for any knowledgeable scholar’s disinterested choices, with this impossible task, there are reasonable reviewers who would judge them to be capricious.)

Now to explicitly address the advertised goals (i.e., [1] for new readers, serving as the most convenient and accessible guide to Russell available, and [2] for specialists, serving as a conspectus of recent developments in Russell scholarship). Well, one thing that should be pointed out with respect to goal [2] is that most of these essays are not themselves intended to be original advances in the interpretation of Russell’s philosophy. Rather, in many cases, the essays are summaries of the author’s recent book (cf. Grattan-Guinness (2000), Hager (1994), Landini (1998), Linsky (1999), Pidgen (1999)). So, specialists who are up to scratch on this secondary literature will already have encountered many of the ideas and theses expounded in the volume. Even so, the volume is a valuable addition to the specialist’s home library, as it is rather handy to have collected together a good summary of important recent contributions to the interpretation of Russell’s philosophy.

As for goal [1], I have had occasion to remark on a couple of relevant criticisms. As mentioned, for example, some of these essays are a bit narrow and advanced for new readers of Russell, and there is, arguably, room for improvement in the overall balance of the coverage. However, I will certainly recommend this volume to students, from introductory to advanced, in search of secondary literature. (Even on the above point about discrepancies in the accessibility and pace of the essays, I should note that these discrepancies are not arbitrary—in general, the most difficult essays are on topics that will only be of interest to more advanced students, while the essays on topics that will draw beginning readers tend to be more elementary.) For anyone looking for a broad, general survey of recent secondary literature on Russell, this volume is without parallel.


Grattan-Guinness, I. (2000) The search for mathematical roots, 1870-1940. Columbus: Ohio State University Press.

Hager, P. (1994) Continuity and change in the development of Russell’s philosophy. Dordrecht: Kluwer.

Landini, G. (1998) Russell’s hidden substitutional theory. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Linsky, B. (1999) Russell’s metaphysical logic. Stanford: CSLI Publications.

Pidgen, C., ed. (1999) Russell on ethics. London: Routledge.