The Cambridge Companion to Boethius

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John Marenbon (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Boethius, Cambridge UP, 2009, 356pp., $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521694254.

Reviewed by Joseph W. Koterski, S.J., Fordham University



The dozen essays collected in this volume succeed in accomplishing the main goals of the “Cambridge Companion” series by providing a convenient guide to a major philosopher. This volume is at once accessible to both beginning students and non-specialists by its introductory essays and useful to advanced students and specialists by surveying recent developments in the scholarship.

To achieve these goals for a figure like Boethius requires putting special focus on three areas for the more technical essays: his logical works, his theological works, and (of course) the Consolation of Philosophy. In addition, the volume contains a charming introduction to the life of Boethius and to the world of late antique philosophy by John Moorhead. That opening essay will provide reliable guidance to newcomers by its explanation of the theological and political intrigues that made Boethius a martyr as well as of the main intellectual trends and problems of his day that elicited his unique contributions to intellectual history.

The trio of essays dedicated to the logical works have a wonderful clarity. Sten Ebbesen examines Boethius’s work as commentator on Aristotle; Christopher J. Martin treats the writings that became textbooks in logic for centuries to come, and thereby gave a distinctive orientation to philosophical education in the middle ages; and Margaret Cameron deals with various philosophical problems associated with the relation of language, thought, and reality. Although Boethius never got beyond handling the Organon in the execution of his project of translating and commenting on the corpus of Aristotle as part of his grandiose ambition of reconciling the thought of Aristotle and Plato, what remains to us of the commentaries that he did complete on these logical works is itself a forest through which Ebbesen’s essay proves a reliable guide. Curious as it might seem to us, some of these commentaries are in the form of fictional dialogues, but most take the more expected analytical form, and some works get a double commentary (one that stays very close to the text, another that is more conceptual and expansive). What is specially helpful about the essay by Ebbesen is its explanation of what Boethius gained for his pedagogical purposes by generally following Porphyry’s interpretations in his presentation of Aristotle’s logic rather than one of the other ancient commentators.

Christopher Martin’s essay rightly concentrates on the Boethian themes that had the greatest influence in the medieval development of logic, namely, the problem of universals, the metaphysics of substance, and the semantics of common names. In this regard, for instance, he stresses Boethius’s account of creaturely goodness in the Quomodo substantiae and his explication of natural kind terms in works like the commentary on Aristotle’s De interpretatione. Martin also gives considerable attention to Boethius’s account of the hypothetical syllogism and recounts in some detail Abelard’s creative appropriation of various insights from the texts of Boethius even as he turned medieval logic away from the Boethian approach and set it in a new direction.

In her study of the triad of elements (utterance, understanding, and reality) in Boethius’s theory of signification, Margaret Cameron treats many of the works already covered by Ebbesen and Martin, but in such a way as to take the reader more deeply into one of the great Aristotelian themes, the semantic triangle of language, thought, and being. She surveys the Boethian contributions to the classic problem of universals as well as the influence that Boethius’s strategic choices about how best to set up the problematic for correlating terms, ideas, and beings had for the variety of solutions that came to be proposed by later medieval thinkers.

The trio of essays dedicated to Boethius’s theological tractates (opuscula sacra) divide the labors needed for handling a set of five highly technical treatises within a collection of this kind. The essay by David Bradshaw provides an overview of the texts, that by Andrew Arlig explores a representative problem of considerable significance, and that by Christophe Erismann examines the main lines of Boethius’s influence on subsequent theology. Like those details of Boethius’s life that are known to us, these works also confirm his unquestioning commitment to Catholic orthodoxy, whatever questions about his religious beliefs are raised by the appeal to philosophy rather than to faith in the Consolation. Bradshaw does a superb job in providing the theological background necessary for appreciating the stands that Boethius takes on such highly complex and contentious issues as the distinctness of the persons of the Holy Trinity, the unity of the divine essence, and the intricacies of the Nestorian and monophysite heresies.

As his choice of a representative problem for more detailed discussion, Andrew Arlig wisely takes up the metaphysics of individuals. Three of the five treatises in the opusucula sacra offer interesting philosophical material on this problem. The perennial issue of giving a suitable philosophical account of the relations of the one and the many attracted Boethius’s attention in the course of handling various theological problems that run from the question of the membership of the divine persons in the Trinity, through the explanation of how individuals of a species belong to a kind, to the recurrent problem of individuation within a species. Arlig carefully distinguishes topics on which the Boethian solution has generally been found more trustworthy, and where it has received more criticism by subsequent thinkers. The famous Boethian definition of “person” is a classic case of a Boethian definition that has proven to be of enduring significance, even though it has long been thought more pertinent to the case of human beings than to the case for which Boethius devised it (the divine persons).

Christopher Erismann surveys the same materials as Bradshaw and Arlig, but from the perspective of the reception of Boethius’s theological ideas by medieval authors. In noting what later theologians adopted from his texts, what they adapted, and what they rejected, Erismann treats not only the history of various particular issues but also comments on his widespread influence on the standard method of doing theology in the centuries that followed. Of special interest in this section is the account of the inspiration that these Boethian theological treatises provided for the twelfth-century School of Chartres on the problem of images and true forms, a central problem for their generally neoplatonic metaphysics.

The final quintet of essays in this volume are devoted to the Consolation. The essays by Lodi Nauta and Winthrop Wetherbee examine its historical legacy, while those by John Magee, Robert Sharples, and Danuta Shanzer consider topics of philosophical interest. Nauta surveys the astounding number of Latin commentaries that were composed on the Consolation from 800 to 1700, while Wetherbee ranges widely across European medieval literature to trace the effect that Boethius had on generations of literary imagination. He notes the echoes of the Consolation not only in such well-known figures as Dante and Chaucer but also in such lesser-known but genuinely creative authors as Bernardus Silvestris, Alan of Lille, and Jean de Meun.

As in the previous two parts of this collection, one of the essays in this section is devoted to a representative philosophical problem. In this case, Robert Sharples tackles the thorny issue of reconciling fate, divine foreknowledge, and human freedom. This problem is, of course, at the center of the Consolation and is the one for which this book is best known in the history of philosophy. After reviewing the course of the argument throughout the Consolation, Sharples comments on the range of problems that Boethius’s text raises without definitively settling them and takes note of the diverse schools of thought on this issue that Boethius’s narrative has spawned.

The hermeneutic difficulties facing any reader of the Consolation are enormous. In appreciation of the variety of interpretations that have been offered, Danuta Shanzer surveys the options and notes some of the advantages and disadvantages likely in each case. Without deciding to back any one of the horses in the race, her essay gives a fine sense of the field. John Magee, on the other hand, urges that we can find clues in Boethius’s own text for at least the proper interpretation of the inner three books (two through four) of the Consolation. He reads them as developing the therapy metaphor that was introduced in book one, for the sake of remedying the emotional ills that have afflicted the author by way of a philosophical regimen. By having Boethius the sick patient remember the Idea of Good that is at the center of Platonic and Neoplatonic metaphysics, he can be led — gently but firmly — to appreciate its moral implications and be restored to the freedom of thought that he presumed he had irretrievably lost at the start of the book.

In addition to providing an extensive bibliography, the volume offers a very helpful annotated list of Boethius’s works as an appendix. This is a well-constructed volume and a useful guide both for beginners and for those already acquainted with Boethius.