The Cambridge Companion to Carnap

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Richard Creath and Michael Friedman (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Carnap, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 371pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521549455.

Reviewed by Gregory Lavers, Concordia University, Montreal


Rudolf Carnap (1891-1970) is by any account a central figure in the history of analytic philosophy. While a student, he took courses on logic with Frege. He corresponded with Russell. He became perhaps the most prominent figure of the Vienna Circle. He was invited to (carefully arranged) meetings with Wittgenstein. He interacted with Gödel on problems in metamathematics. He discussed semantics at length with Tarski. He had Quine as a self-described disciple (see Carnap and Quine 1990). From this perspective he formulated an original and radically relativistic philosophical position. While he did change his views over time, giving many of his theses several reformulations, his philosophy was always governed by the spirit of the principle of tolerance (even before its explicit formulation in Carnap 1934/37). It is ironic that a philosopher whose views on most subjects arose out of his attitude of tolerance became known as dogmatic and close-minded. There has been an explosion of interest in Carnap in recent years, with many talented researchers attempting to correct misrepresentations and expose Carnap's actual position on various subjects, including epistemology, logic and the foundations of mathematics, semantics, the philosophy of science, probability and induction, and finally the nature of philosophy itself. It is from amongst this field of researchers that The Cambridge Companion to Carnap (CCC) draws. The CCC is a collection of fourteen essays by leading Carnap scholars or experts on the history of analytic philosophy more generally. The essays are organized chronologically according to the period of Carnap's life with which they are principally concerned. They cover a broad range of topics and every major phase of Carnap's career is treated. There is a short preface (five pages) by Richard Creath and an introduction (eighteen pages) by Michael Friedman. The book also contains an index and a unified bibliography.

Both Creath's preface and Friedman's introduction stress, not only the central importance of Carnap in twentieth century analytic philosophy, but also the poor state of understanding of Carnap's philosophy in the philosophical community. They point out that only relatively recently has the full subtleness and originality of Carnap's philosophy been properly understood by Carnap scholarship. Concerning the goal of the volume Friedman writes:

[W]e are primarily concerned, in general, to expose the originality and depth of Carnap's overall position, which amounts to an entirely novel philosophical perspective on empiricism and the critique of metaphysics, on logicism and the analytic/synthetic distinction, on the role of logic within philosophy as a discipline, and on the relationship between philosophy and the empirical sciences. (3)

In achieving this goal, this collection of essays is very successful. The essays are all of very good quality, many excellent, and the selection of contributors is well chosen. This book includes a sampling of some of the best new research on Carnap. As such, it is useful both as an introduction to Carnap scholarship for those not yet familiar with the area, and as a useful reference for those already working on Carnap.

As mentioned above, Creath and Friedman both stress the progress that has been made recently in terms of understanding Carnap's philosophy. They contrast this with the caricatured understanding of Carnap that had dominated until quite recently. On the caricature understanding Carnap's philosophy is reduced to certain early formulations of the verifiability principle. Quine's criticisms in "Two Dogmas of Empiricism" are then mistakenly seen as a definitive refutation of Carnap's philosophical position. It is also mistakenly assumed that Carnap held that there is a completely theory independent level of description and, so, Kuhn's work is also seen as a refutation. To this list of erroneous but often repeated refutations of Carnap's philosophy, though not mentioned by Creath or Friedman, I would add the view that Carnap's philosophy of mathematics is ruled out by Gödel's incompleteness theorems (especially the first). This is not to say that this last cliché goes uncorrected in the present volume. Thomas Ricketts' piece, on Carnap's Logical Syntax of Language and Carnap's philosophy of mathematics more generally, as well as Steve Awodey's article, on Carnap's attempts to define analyticity, explain the true relation between Carnap's definitions of analyticity and the first incompleteness theorem. Erich E. Reck's article, although focusing on Carnap's pre-1930 work on logic and metamathematics, ends with a discussion of how the incompleteness theorems should be seen as fitting into Carnap's body of work on logic and the foundations of mathematics. These three articles together provide a great introduction to Carnap as a philosopher of logic and mathematics.

Creath and Friedman are right to point out what great strides have been taken recently in Carnap scholarship -- even if one considers just the last ten to fifteen years. Since the 1990s Carnap scholarship has made significant advances. During the 1990s it seemed that most of even the best work on Carnap shared a certain quite annoying form. It would first be argued that Carnap's views were quite seriously misunderstood. The intricacies of the position would next be spelled out in detail. And then in the final paragraph, usually towards the end, it would be asserted, with at most the hint of an argument, that Carnap's position is nonetheless indefensible for exactly the reasons that Quine identified. Sometimes the final paragraph would dismiss Carnap's philosophy for other reasons, but often enough the reasons were Quinean. As a graduate student at the time I had assumed that such a final paragraph was seen as necessary in order to meet the standards for publication when the subject was Carnap's philosophy. In the volume presently under consideration only Thomas Ryckman's paper is clearly of this form. Ryckman's piece on Husserl and Carnap begins by stating that the relation between Carnap's and Husserl's philosophical positions is not well understood. Ryckman supposes that most would see these two philosophers as having nothing in common. He then shows that Carnap and Husserl deal with many of the same problems and differ only in their final positions. Quine is not discussed until, of course, the very last paragraph. There Quine's own assessment of his disagreement with Carnap is presented as inevitable truth and as ultimately a vindication of Husserl over Carnap. I said that Ryckman's piece is the only clear example of a paper in this annoying form in the CCC. Ricketts' piece, however, comes dangerously close to assuming this form. It is saved only by the noncommittal nature of the concluding sentence:

However, given the resources Carnap deploys in order to build mathematics into his preferred formal languages, many will find Carnap's treatment of the difference between mathematics and natural science more a labeling than an explication, and so no more satisfying than Quine's denial of a sharp difference. (225)

Having said that, the present volume as a whole treats the identification of where Carnap went wrong as an undertaking worthy of serious attention, one from which a lot can be learned, and certainly not to be treated carelessly in the very last paragraph.

Creath's own piece for the collection concerns the Carnap/Quine controversy. This piece may seem to break the chronological order of the volume as it deals with the Carnap/Quine controversy, which takes place primarily in the early fifties, but appears as the last essay in the book. Its placement seems to be justified by the fact that although it deals with material from around 1950, it is concerned to reverse the view of Carnap's philosophy since his death, the view dominated by the impression that Quine definitively refuted Carnap. Creath explains how problems in both the philosophy of logic as well as in the philosophy of geometry lead Carnap to his mature view with the concept of analyticity at the center. The rest of the paper discusses Quine's challenge to Carnap to give behavioral criteria of analyticity. Creath claims that Carnap can largely ignore this as he is not concerned to show that actual English speakers, for instance, hold mathematics to be analytic. Instead, Carnap is proposing certain constructed languages as reconstructions of our knowledge of, for example, mathematics. But if these proposed languages are to be more than just abstract objects with no connections with languages actually used by humans, there has to be some empirical possibility that the proposed language could actually be accepted. We must then give empirical meaning to whether or not the language has been accepted. That is, we must state under what conditions we could say that the set of sentences called analytic in the language are held to be analytic by human beings. Creath then points out that Quine himself on two occasions has given what amounts to a behavioral definition of analyticity that could be used for this purpose. I take Creath's argument, which both appreciates Quine's demands for empirical significance and Carnap's reasons for viewing them as irrelevant, to be definitive, and believe this article should become a starting point for those wishing to comment on the Carnap/Quine controversy in the future.

Two of the articles in the volume concern the interpretation of the Aufbau. The question of how the project of the Aufbau is meant to be interpreted is often phrased as whether or not Carnap was attempting to carry out the simplistic empiricist reduction of experience to the given, with which Russell was engaged in Our Knowledge of the External World. Christopher Pincock, quite reasonably, rejects the interpretation of Russell implicit in this question. Russell's view that we are acquainted with universals and that we must have some general knowledge that is independent of experience immediately disqualifies him from carrying out a reductive empiricist project. These views in turn are motivated by Russell's realism, which leads him to want both to hold that sense data are independent of the observer and to preserve, as much as possible, common sense and physical laws. Pincock concludes that Carnap's relativism prevents him from sharing Russell's realist position and leads to a growing divergence in their views throughout the thirties and forties. Carnap's claimed neutrality between realism and idealism is the subject of Friedman's article, the other article that deals with the interpretation of the Aufbau. Friedman points out that the Aufbau predates the view, inspired by Wittgenstein, that metaphysical statements are devoid of cognitive content. Friedman, therefore, devotes a great deal of attention to identifying in what the rejection of metaphysics in the Aufbau consists.

Thomas Uebel's contribution concerns Carnap's interactions with Schlick and Neurath. Uebel begins by discussing their respective stances on Wittgenstein, with Schlick being a follower, Neurath an opponent, and Carnap attempting to hold an intermediate position. Uebel discusses the debate between Carnap and Neurath concerning the role and form of protocol sentences and concerning the coherence of Carnap's position of methodological solipsism in the Aufbau. Neurath argues that the autopsychological perspective depends on the physicalist language, and so, the position of methodological solipsism is incoherent. This contrasts with the position of Schlick who ties protocol sentences to a correspondence theory of truth. Uebel then shows how, by making two significant shifts, Carnap was able to describe an original and independent position that is not simply an intermediate position between that of Schlick and Neurath. The first shift involved changing his focus from the psychological/epistemic questions with which the Aufbau is primarily concerned to logical questions of confirmation that make no mention of a knowing subject. The second consisted in accepting Tarskian semantics. Uebel correctly maintains that by accepting Tarskian semantics Carnap did not take himself to be defending a correspondence theory of truth. Uebel quotes Carnap's 1935 paper 'Truth and Confirmation' where Carnap warns against "the absolutistic view according to which we are said to search for an absolute reality whose nature is assumed as fixed independently of the language chosen for its description." (Carnap, 1936/1949) Neurath, as is well known, was quite hostile to semantics because he saw it as leading to a reintroduction of metaphysics into philosophy. This early episode in the history of semantics is, I believe, a very interesting one that deserves more attention than it gets, because what led Neurath to reject semantics and what Carnap thought could be avoided has now become commonplace. That semantics can provide the ultimate link between language and the world is now taken for granted in much of philosophical discussion.

Let me at least mention the contributions not already touched on, so that the reader of this review will have a clear idea of the book's contents. Andre W. Carus's contribution traces Carnap's intellectual development from his involvement in a German youth movement to his mature philosophical position. Carus explains that the 'voluntarism' associated with the youth movement was typified by a rejection of the bourgeois conventions of the older generation. Carus then traces the spirit of this voluntarism through the Aufbau, to the principle of tolerance and ultimately to Carnap's mature views on explication. Thomas Mormann's piece principally concerns Carnap's work Der Raum. He claims that Carnap's more general conventionalism stems from his early work in the philosophy of geometry. Gottfried Gabriel's article is a detailed discussion of Frege's influences on Carnap and the similarities and differences between their views on a variety of issues. William Demopoulos's article concerns how Carnap uses Ramsey sentences and what are now called Carnap sentences to explain our understanding of theoretical terms. Demopoulos argues that although this view of scientific theories has many attractive features, we should reject the claim that our understanding of a theory's factual content is given by the Ramsey sentence. Sandy Zabell's article is about the long period of Carnap's career devoted to probability and induction. This article is a survey of many issues, and helpfully suggests further reading on the various points. Alan Richardson's article covers the relation between Carnap and the American pragmatists. The principle difference is identified as that the pragmatists wished to build a concept of human flourishing into science, while Carnap saw all value claims as being necessarily outside the system of scientific statements.

On the whole, the CCC is an excellent collection of work. The book covers, as the brief descriptions above show, a wide range of topics. It is evident that care was taken to ensure that the various articles are accessible to the newcomer but this is done, in general, without sacrificing the demands of careful in-depth scholarship. The care taken to represent Carnap's true philosophical position and expose misunderstandings will, we can hope, elevate the level of discussion concerning one of the most influential philosophers of the twentieth century.


Carnap, R. 1934/37. Logische Syntax der Sprache, Vienna, Springer. Translated by Ameathe Smeaton as The Logical Syntax of Language. London, Keagan Paul, Trench, Trubner & Co.

Carnap, R. 1936/49. "Wahrheit und Bewärhung," Actes du Congrès Internationale de Philosophie Scientific, Paris 1935, Facs 4, Induction et Probabilité, Paris, Hermann & Cie. Translated by H. Feigl as "Truth and Confirmation" in Readings in Philosophical Analysis, H. Feigl and W. Sellars eds. New York, Appleton-Century-Crofts.

Carnap, R. and W. Quine, 1990. Dear Carnap, Dear Van: The Quine-Carnap Correspondence and Related Work, R. Creath ed. Los Angeles, University of California Press.