The Cambridge Companion to Deleuze

Placeholder book cover

Daniel W. Smith and Henry Somers-Hall (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Deleuze, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 392pp., $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521175715.


Reviewed by Dianna Taylor, John Carroll University


The work of Gilles Deleuze is challenging on multiple levels. For those who are unfamiliar with it, Deleuze's work doesn't offer obvious points of entry, and his terminology can be difficult to comprehend and employ. At the same time, even for more seasoned philosophers Deleuze's work can raise some vexing questions concerning, for example, the precise nature of his philosophical project (does he aim to provide an account of the nature of reality, or does he deploy an ontology of difference in order to unsettle such accounts?), how various aspects of his work contribute to his overall philosophical project (how do his analyses of figures within the history of philosophy inform his later work?), and ultimately, how and to what extent his work may be situated within, at the same time that it challenges and even departs from, the tradition of Western philosophy.

By engaging these questions, as well as others, in a variety of ways and on multiple levels, This collection provides a welcome addition to Deleuze scholarship. Editors Daniel W. Smith and Henry Somers-Hall have compiled an excellent group of essays that simultaneously offers innovative perspectives on, while also providing an extremely helpful point of entry into, a provocative body of work that, precisely because it is provocative, can also appear rather daunting.

Although it's possible for readers to choose their own points of entry into an edited volume, from my perspective all would do well to orient themselves by way of Somers-Hall's clear, concise, and informative Introduction and then turn directly to the volume's first chapter: Daniel W. Smith's, "Deleuze and the History of Philosophy." By clarifying the relationship between Deleuze's work in the history of philosophy and work in which Deleuze develops his own philosophical project, Smith provides a framework for reading not only Deleuze, but also the rest of the Companion itself.

While Smith acknowledges that the connection between Deleuze's work in the history of philosophy and that which reflects his own philosophical "voice" may not be readily apparent, he nonetheless argues that the former was fundamental in Deleuze's articulation of his own unique "heterogenetic and differential metaphysical system" (13). That this connection is in fact an interconnection is, according to Smith, illustrated by way of the methodology that Deleuze employs in all of his historical analyses. First, he "explicates" the work of the thinker under consideration; next, he presents his own "interpretation" of the thinker's work; finally, by "pushing each thinker . . . to their differential limit," Deleuze ceases simply to comment on the work of other philosophers and begins instead to create a philosophy of his own (20). Deleuze conceives of philosophy specifically as the creation of concepts, but he also considers concepts themselves to be inherently creative insofar as they possess both "exo-consistency" and "endo-consistency" (23). By virtue of the former, concepts are able to "link up with" other concepts; by virtue of the latter, their individual component parts are themselves concepts with the potential for multiple linkages (23). Doing philosophy, for Deleuze, is thus a critical and creative process of challenging and ultimately transcending limits imposed by prevailing modes of thought and existence (30). As Smith notes, Deleuze's work in the history of philosophy and his own philosophical project "coincide" precisely within this process (30).

Just as the framework of analysis Smith provides reveals a critical and creative relationship between Deleuze's historical and philosophical work, so does it facilitate an understanding of Deleuze's relationship to the Western philosophical tradition in these same terms. The process of working out the point at which Deleuze parts company with other thinkers and begins to speak in his own philosophical voice is an important way in which readers grapple with and ultimately make sense of Deleuze's philosophy; indeed, it may be viewed as the critical and creative work of philosophy itself. The tensions between Deleuze's own work, his relationship to (historical) figures, and to the tradition of Western philosophy as a whole is thus a productive one.

I suggest that it's both possible and productive to approach this volume by means of this same framework of analysis that values as productive the tension(s) generated through the exercise of critical and creative capacities. Doing so makes clear the extent to which the volume contributes to Deleuze scholarship not merely as explication and interpretation of Deleuze's work, but as itself a work of philosophy in the specifically Deleuzian sense. All of the essays in the volume explicate and interpret Deleuze's work. In doing so, they perform a function that is analogous to that which Deleuze's historical work performs and can therefore be seen to function as part of the tradition of Western philosophy.

Several essays directly analyze Deleuze's relationship to other thinkers, thereby providing a diversity of perspectives on how his relationship to history and tradition informs the development and articulation of his own philosophical voice. Miguel de Beistegui's and Beth Lord's respective essays on Plato and Kant provide invaluable insight into how two historical thinkers with whom Deleuze considered himself to have an oppositional relationship nonetheless influenced his work in important ways. Deleuze developed his notions of difference and repetition by means of a "reversal of Platonism," whereas he shares with Kant a "commitment to the 'unthought' that generates thought" (55; 99). Henry Somers-Hall's contribution addresses the influence on Deleuze of a more recent philosopher of whom Deleuze was openly critical: Martin Heidegger. According to Somers-Hall, for Heidegger, Deleuze, and for Deleuze's own contemporary critic Alain Badiou, "the central problem for philosophy emerges from thinking about totality" (337). As reflected in the sub-title of his essay ("Guattareuze & Co."), Gary Genosko effectively conveys the complex nature even of Deleuze's philosophical collaborations by analyzing his relationship to Félix Guattari.

While the rest of the essays in the Companion cover a wide range of topics, they nonetheless in some way all address or are informed to at least some degree by, and hence provide critical insight into, Deleuze's relationship to both other thinkers and tradition. Through analyzing Deleuze's appeal to, respectively, mathematics and literature, Manuel Delanda and Ronald Bogue elucidate the complex nature of Deleuze's participation in, as well as ways in which his work parts company with, the tradition of Western philosophy. Delanda argues that Deleuze was a "realist philosopher" who nonetheless broke with realism as it has been conceptualized since Aristotle; Bogue shows how Deleuze's engagement with literary texts helped shape the uniquely creative aspects of his philosophy. François Dosse and Eugene W. Holland consider Deleuze's relationship to other intellectual movements. Dosse contends that Deleuze's work with Guattari provides a "lively critique of structuralism" (126); Holland argues that the nature and function of psychoanalysis within the work of Deleuze and Guattari cannot be understood without taking into account Deleuze's relationship to the work of Nietzsche, Kant, Bergson, and Jung.

Four essays provide new perspectives on important Deleuzian concepts. Through analyzing Deleuze's book, Difference and Repetition, James Williams incisively clarifies how the work of a divergent group of historical philosophers (Hume, Kant, and Nietzsche) informs Deleuze's transcendental empiricism. According to Leonard Lawlor, "Deleuze's thought cannot be understood unless we recognize its similarities to phenomenology" (103). Lawlor carefully explicates points of intersection between Deleuze's work and phenomenology in order to offer a novel approach to understanding his concept of the event. Similarly, Dorothea Olkowski contends that "all of Deleuze's philosophy may be encountered from the point of view of aesthetics" (283). She employs this perspective for the specific purpose of explicating the significance of sensibility within Deleuze's work. John Protevi illustrates how, in Deleuze's hands, even the concept of life acquires a unique and complex significance relative to both philosophy and biology that unsettles and thus calls for its critical reappraisal within both disciplines (and by doing so unsettles the disciplines themselves).

Finally, two essays address the issue of life in the specific sense of living in and thus engaging the world. Rosi Braidotti provides a compelling reading of Deleuze's ethics that illustrates its indebtedness to the work of Nietzsche. For Deleuze, as for Nietzsche, Braidotti argues, the "defining moment for the process of becoming ethical" entails confronting the pain of human existence without succumbing to the "stultifying effects of passivity" that pain induces (189). Paul Patton illustrates how Deleuze, especially in his collaboration with Guattari, simultaneously appeals to and calls for the reconceptualization of normative political concepts. In his analysis, Patton makes the crucial point that through its own such reconceptualization, Deleuze and Guattari's work opens onto (possibilities for) new and potentially emancipatory political forms.

By situating Deleuze's work relative to the history of philosophy, the philosophical tradition, and Western thought more broadly, in the ways I have described above, individual chapters in the Companion, as well as the volume as a whole, also provide a ground from which to embark upon critical analysis of where Deleuze takes his leave of history (as well as the influence of more contemporary thinkers), when and how he begins to speak in his own philosophical voice, what that voice sounds like, and what it seeks to articulate. Yet the volume also takes its own leave(s) and develops its own voice(s) -- that is, the volume performs not only the critical but also the creative work of Deleuzian philosophy. Each author not only explicates and interprets Deleuze's (and others') philosophical work. Each also pushes that work to its limit, pushes it to the point where that work is departed from and the philosophy of individual contributors begins to be created. Individual chapters can therefore be seen to possess their own "endo-consistency," so to speak, in the sense that each author creates a set of linkages between her or his own ideas or "concepts" and those of Deleuze; connections are also made, as noted above, between Deleuze's concepts and those of other (historical) thinkers, intellectual movements, disciplines, and problems -- as well as between various Deleuzian concepts themselves. "Exo-consistency" is apparent in the possibilities for linkages between and among the various chapters. (How) did Deleuze's relationship to Plato and Kant shape his particular approaches to ethics and politics? (How) do his appeals to literature and math influence the way in which he formulates his own philosophical concepts? What points of intersection and departure can be discerned between Deleuze's relationship to intellectual movements like structuralism and psychoanalysis and his relationship to the Western philosophical tradition?

Through the linkages it creates, this volume affirms Deleuze's characterization of philosophy as promoting critique and creation. And yet the volume does not only create linkages; it opens onto the possibility for existing connections to be critically analyzed and new ones to be made: hence philosophy as promoting spaces of critical and creative becoming. Read as a work of philosophy in these terms, this volume affords readers the opportunity to explore the complex relationship an innovative philosopher had to his own intellectual heritage, and how that relationship informs but does not limit his own philosophical innovation. Consistent with Deleuze's philosophy, this opportunity is also a challenge for readers to critically engage their own such relationships and through doing so create (possibilities for) new ones. From Deleuze's perspective, working out whether and how new linkages might emerge and what form they might take is itself the work of philosophy. Insofar as this is the case, a unique strength of this volume is that it affords its readers practice not only in reading philosophy, but also in doing it.