The Cambridge Companion to Descartes' Meditations

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David Cunning (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Descartes' Meditations, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 320pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107630482.

Reviewed by Geoffrey Gorham, Macalester College


This companion comprises two essays on each of the six Meditations, along with three thematic essays on method, dualism and God. The editor provides a substantial introduction, which summarizes the contributions and identifies some of the central aims and methods of the Meditations. The bibliography simply lists the works referenced in the essays (mostly recent secondary literature or late scholastic/seventeenth century works from Descartes' intellectual milieu); all references to Descartes' own works are to the standard Adam/Tannery edition (AT) and/or the popular translation by Cottingham et al. (CSM). The papers are generally focused on the philosophical concepts, arguments and methods of the Meditations (as well as the much longer, appended Objections and Replies) rather than its composition, editing, reception, etc. The contributors are mostly prominent Anglophone Descartes scholars -- a slight majority are women.

The best essay of the volume is the first, Christia Mercer's searching, historically rich analysis of Descartes' 'meditative method'. Mercer situates Descartes' deliberate, first-personal style within a long Christian tradition running from Augustine through Teresa of Avila, Ignatius of Loyola, and others. Descartes' relation to this tradition has been noted by other commentators, as Mercer acknowledges, but she sheds new light on the crucial role of 'meditation' in the transformative project of the Meditations. The next two essays, by Charles Larmore and David Cunning, concern the First Meditation. Larmore focuses on Descartes' use of skeptical arguments, showing very clearly how they are specifically targeted at the reigning empiricist epistemology of scholasticism. Cunning's paper is also focused on skepticism or doubt, but is less incisive, ranging over a broad range of problems that are not central to the Meditations themselves, including free will and the creation of the eternal truths. There is much of philosophical interest in the chapter; however, relative newcomers to the Meditations may come away from the chapter no less puzzled than they were upon first reading the original text.  The same is true of a few other essays (e.g., those of Katherine Morris, Amy Schmitter, Olli Koistinen).

Lilli Alanen's discussion of the nature of the human mind in the Second Meditation is detailed and compelling, whereas Katherine Morris' discussion of the famous wax example is somewhat halting and inconclusive. Alanen argues that Descartes is concerned early on to downplay the role of the body in human cognition, not only in relation to the intellect but also in relation to the imagination, sensation and the will  Nevertheless, the theory of the mind-body 'union' that comes in the Sixth Meditation shows that Descartes is not only concerned with the intellect, but also with 'the human mind, a mind destined to be and already in fact embodied' (103). Morris' unorthodox essay -- which involves very close, successive re-readings of the wax passage -- introduces more ambivalence and complications than seems warranted by Descartes' preliminary discussion of the nature of body (whose existence is of course not even known until the Sixth Meditation). Nevertheless, both chapters provide interesting interpretations of Descartes' insistence that the mind is better known than the body.

Lawrence Nolan helpfully distills and defends the two Third Meditation proofs of God's existence, which have often been maligned for (among other things) relying on obscure scholastic principles about causality and 'degrees of reality'. Nolan's reconstructions of the arguments eschew such principles in favor of more familiar and intuitive axioms like nothing can come from nothing (ex nihilo nihil fit). But if, as Descartes himself argues, this axiom is really equivalent to his causal principles (AT 7: 135) -- which he also employs in the Sixth Meditation proof of the external world -- it's not clear how much the proofs are finally simplified or improved by Nolan's reconstructions. In any case, his analysis suggests a novel and interesting way of conceiving the connection between the two proofs. Amy Schmitter provides a detailed analysis of Descartes' understanding of the scholastic notion of 'objective' (representational) reality, which he employs in the Third and Sixth Meditations. She ultimately suggests, contrary to Cartesian orthodoxy, that his version of the notion involves a kind of 'externalism'. Unfortunately, Schmitter does not explain this technical term of recent origin, and I suspect non-expert readers of the Meditations will not find that it clarifies significantly Descartes' own appeal to the technical vocabulary of scholasticism.

The essays on the brief 'theodical' Fourth Meditation focus on Descartes' conception of the will. Thomas Lennon offers a very subtle account of the relations among volition, judgment and freedom, which focuses carefully on the language of the Meditation itself. In contrast, Cecilia Wee must go far beyond the Meditations to undergird her 'libertarian' interpretation of Cartesian freedom. As Wee acknowledges, the Fourth Meditation itself seems to allow, perhaps even require, intellectual determinism (a typically Augustinian stance on freedom according to Lennon). But with some 'shoehorning' of texts (as Lennon puts it (185n18)), Wee stakes out a defensible if unusual position in the recently raging debate about Cartesian freedom. But this defense takes us so far from the Meditations themselves, and into scholarly controversies, that readers may worry they have strayed from Descartes' demand that we 'meditate seriously' and withdraw from all 'preconceived opinions' ('Preface to the Reader; AT 7: 9).

The Fifth Meditation essays are both mainly concerned with Descartes's doctrine of 'true and immutable natures' (such as the truths of geometry). Descartes introduces this doctrine in preparation for the proof that God's nature entails his existence. Tad Schmaltz provides a useful overview of the longstanding debate about the ontological grounding of these natures (are they in themselves? in the mind? in the world?), concluding that Descartes himself might not have resolved this age-old problem to his own satisfaction. Following this discussion, Schmaltz digresses on Kant's objection to the ontological argument, siding with Kant against Descartes. Olli Koistinen also engages Kant, though he thinks Descartes' ontological argument escapes Kant's objections: 'Kant may have proved that it is impossible to prove the existence of God from concepts alone; but that was not what Descartes was trying to do' (235-36). What Descartes was trying to do, according to Koistinen, was prove that God, as an absolutely independent being, could not be thought not to exist (231). While I think I see Koistinen's point, I'm not sure it will be so clear to those seeking a 'companion' to the Meditations, since such a reader will typically not be already steeped in ontology and in Kant.

The lengthy Sixth Meditation, which takes up the mind-body distinction (and union), is discussed in two excellent essays by Deborah Brown and Alison Simmons. Brown emphasizes and explores the distinction, for Descartes, between the metaphysical question of dualism ('what am I?') and the existential question of embodiment ('who am I?'). She argues that the latter question, which concerns the nature of the Cartesian person (rather than thinking substance), is very important to Descartes. Simmons explains the several ways, especially sensation, that God has seen to it that our bodies help us negotiate the world, despite our metaphysical and epistemological separation from body. After the strongly rationalist message of earlier chapters, Simmons' essay effectively brings home Descartes' deep engagement with the intricate problems of mind-body union.

The volume ends with two brief thematic essays that broach the Descartes-Spinoza connection. Alan Nelson judiciously compares the metaphysical underpinning of Descartes' and Spinoza's versions of mind-body dualism, not-so-surprisingly concluding that 'Spinoza's system is permeated by problems connected with dualism' (292). Annette Baier, in a welcome, sadly posthumous essay -- the volume is dedicated to Baier and to the Descartes scholar Paul Hoffman, also recently deceased -- points out that Descartes' God seems sometimes very heterodox, even Spinozistic. For example, in the Sixth Meditation Descartes says 'by nature in general I mean God' (AT 7: 80), and in the Principles of Philosophy, anticipating Spinoza, Descartes insists that we can never derive any explanation from the purposes of 'God or nature'. (AT 8A: 15)

The Meditations is explicitly a work on the foundations of metaphysics and epistemology ('prima philosophia') so it is appropriate that Descartes' views on ethics, biology and the passions are mostly ignored in this volume. More surprising is the scant discussion of Descartes' physics or mechanical philosophy -- e.g., res extensa, plenism, the laws of nature -- for which the Meditations provided the framework. This framework is what was really revolutionary about the Meditations, rather than the skeptical arguments, cogito ergo sum, mind-body distinction/union, and so on. Thus, Descartes confessed in a letter to Mersenne that the 'Meditations contain all the foundations of my physics'. But he pleads with Mersenne to keep quiet about the true purpose of the Meditations since 'it might make it harder for the supporters of Aristotle to approve them' (AT 3: 297-8).

As is to be expected, the quality of these fifteen essays varies somewhat, but each makes interesting and challenging contributions to our understanding of the infinitely (or indefinitely) intriguing and influential Meditations. Some of them (particularly those by Mercer, Lennon and Brown) are gems that will be pored over by Descartes scholars and teachers. Although there are a few typos, and a rather perfunctory bibliography, the volume is very well edited,  well introduced and well produced. However, for better or worse, several of the papers are more concerned to advance or defend an original interpretation of a relatively isolated issue in Descartes' philosophy than present a comprehensive reconstruction and critical analysis of the Meditations. So this volume might initially seem slightly more attractive as a dinner date (clever and provocative) than a longtime companion (reliable and thorough). Then again, lasting friendships need to start somewhere.