The Cambridge Companion to Duns Scotus

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Williams, Thomas (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Duns Scotus, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 424pp, $23.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521635632.

Reviewed by Stephen D. Dumont, University of Notre Dame


With this installment of The Cambridge Companion, the series now provides volumes on all three of the principal scholastic figures: Thomas Aquinas (eds. Kretzmann and Stump, 1993), William of Ockham (ed. Spade, 1999), and John Duns Scotus (1266-1308), who falls chronologically and, in a sense, intellectually between the other two great medievals. The need for a Companion on Scotus was arguably greater than for one on either Aquinas or Ockham, not only because Scotus remains less familiar, even among specialists, but because there has not been a comprehensive book on his philosophy in a half-century. (Richard Cross’s recent Duns Scotus [Oxford, 1999] comes to mind, but it was expressly written as a survey of Scotus’s theology, not his philosophy.) For the last such study on Scotus one must go back fifty years to Étienne Gilson’s mammoth but ill-timed Jean Duns Scot. Introduction à ses positions fondamentales (Paris: Vrin, 1952), which was outdated before it even appeared. Readied for press just as the initial volumes of the first critical edition of Scotus’s writings were published, Jean Duns Scot was not only the last comprehensive study of Scotus’s philosophy, but also the last major study on Scotus of any kind not based upon a single line of any modern version of his notoriously unstable texts. Such was the discrepancy between the Scotus of Jean Duns Scot and the one revealed in the newly established texts, that Gilson himself warned readers in the preface that his Scotus did not conform to historical reality. The appearance of the Cambridge Companion to Duns Scotus is therefore welcome and important. Having replaced the flawed Jean Duns Scot, it is currently not just the first place to go for a comprehensive work on Scotus’s philosophy, but the only place.

What kind of replacement this volume forms is clear from its abstract on the flyleaf: “The essays in this volume systematically survey the full range of Scotus’s thought. They … explain the technical details of his writing … and demonstrate the relevance of his work to contemporary philosophical debate.” This is entirely accurate. The book is a systematic rather than historical survey of Scotus’s thought that is on the whole technical and directed at the professional philosopher.

The volume is indeed comprehensive. It contains an introduction to Scotus’s life and works (Williams) and twelve substantial chapters arranged broadly according to present-day systematic areas of philosophy. The lead and anchor chapter of the volume is an extensive overview of Scotus’s metaphysics (c.1, Peter King), followed by entries on three metaphysical topics: space and time (c. 2, Neil Lewis), universals and particulars (c. 3, Timothy Noone) and modality (c. 4, Calvin Normore). The next largest area is philosophy of religion, which comprises two chapters: one on God’s existence and attributes (c. 6, James Ross and Todd Bates) and another on our knowledge of God (c. 7, William Mann). Perhaps the most active area of recent research on Scotus has been in his ethics, so there are three chapters covering that: natural law (c. 10, Hannes Möhle), metaethics (c. 11, Williams) and virtue theory (c. 12, Bonnie Kent). The area treatment of the volume is rounded out with single chapters on Scotus’s philosophy of language (c. 5, Dominik Perler), mind (c. 8, Richard Cross) and knowledge (c. 9, Robert Pasnau). The only area not covered is political and social thought, which, while not non-existent in Scotus, is not prominent either, and in any case does not begin to approach the contributions of Aquinas and Ockham.

Of course, the divisions of modern philosophy do not carve medieval topics at the joints, but the volume succeeds fairly well in canvassing Scotus’s more important contributions: the univocity of the transcendental concepts, the reality of universals, the formal distinction, the modal proof for the existence of God, synchronic contingency, the abandonment of illumination and the positing of an intellectual intuition. Nonetheless, because the modern and medieval philosophical grids do not align, there is some repetition and piecemeal treatment, so that for instance Scotus’s arguments for univocity are taken up twice (pp. 18-21, 246-47) and his proofs for the existence of God three times (pp. 43-46, 137-140, 198-209). As noted below, some topics drop out altogether. On the positive side, the organization by area has paid off by producing two excellent chapters on topics rarely discussed in works on Scotus, his physics (Lewis) and semantic theory (Perler), although recent books by Richard Cross (The Physics of Duns Scotus [Oxford, 1998]) and Giorgio Pini (Categories and Logic in Duns Scotus [Leiden, 2002]) have now put these areas more squarely on the Scotus map. Despite all this coverage, there are some gaps.

In a general vein, there is no chapter giving an overview of Scotus’s historical period and his position in it, such as those by William Courtenay and Jan Aertsen in the Ockham and Aquinas Companions respectively. Williams’ introduction rehearses in some detail Scotus’s academic career and works, but this does not place him in any historical or intellectual context. What the reader requires is a sketch of Scotus’s relation to other major figures in the period, his intellectual influences, the debated issues and intellectual currents of his time, the chief tendencies of his thought and so forth. Ideally, such a larger picture provides a framework to integrate the ensuing chapters that otherwise become discrete discussions. At the other end of the volume, a closing chapter on the legacy of Scotus in modern philosophy, which is substantial and increasingly appreciated, would have been appropriate and highly useful.

Perhaps most conspicuous is the absence of a chapter, or even dedicated section of a chapter, on Scotus’s concept of will. To be sure, there are discussions of various aspects of Scotus’s theory of will scattered across the contributions, but in them the will is subordinated to other issues. Moreover, some important aspects, such the causal relation between intellect and will, are not dealt with at all. Given both the universally recognized importance of Scotus’s concept of the will and the defining character of voluntarism in his thought, some more extended, express treatment seems demanded. Such a dedicated chapter seems to have fallen between the cracks of the systematic areas into which the volume is divided. Other standardly important results that one might have expected to see treated or treated more prominently within chapters are Scotus’s rejection of the Boethian-Thomistic model of divine foreknowledge and his diminution of the reality of the divine ideas with the resulting elimination of exemplarity as a separate genus of cause.

The contributions themselves are on the whole of a high quality. They are largely well-written, informed and reliable accounts of Scotus that refrain from advancing novel interpretations or revising widely accepted ones. Overall, however, they seem shaded toward the specialist. Four of the entries approach or exceed 100 endnotes, while the volume as a whole has a scholarly apparatus of more than 900 notes in addition to in-text citations. At places, the reader is expected to be acquainted with some of Scotus’s lesser known contemporaries, deal with Latin or manuscript citations in the notes and follow intricate argument or refined conceptual analysis. Certainly, not all of the pieces lean toward the specialist. Bonnie Kent’s chapter on Scotus’s virtue theory is a model of synoptic treatment. Abstaining from technicalities, it puts into relief distinctive features of Scotus’s doctrine of the virtues against the larger background of Aristotle, Augustine and Aquinas. At the same time, it is not a mere summary, but manages to be instructive to the specialist while accessible to the non-specialist. At the other extreme is the Ross/Bates article on natural theology. Lacking even an introductory paragraph, the chapter immediately plunges the reader into seven technically stated claims about Scotus’s proof for the existence of God and theory of the divine attributes. The piece is densely written, heavy with both scholastic and contemporary terminology and crowded with topics. It provides virtually no general view at all, only detail. Other pieces, while providing an overview, descend occasionally to levels of detail that could interest only the specialist, as when King teases apart how Scotus defines Aristotle’s third class of relation (pp. 36-37). Thus, while the quality of the pieces is on the high side, at places so is their level of difficulty, at least relative to the intended audience of the Cambridge Companion series.

Although the entries are reliable, a few misstatements, or at least misleading statements, of Scotus’s positions have crept in. For instance, according to Normore, Scotus holds that God is not the partial co-cause of volition in the rational creature, but the cause only of the will, which in turn is the sole cause of its act: “Hence, while God causes any given human will, God does not cause the willing of that will… . Scotus seems to think that the only efficient cause of a willing is the will that does it. God is not another, partial, efficient cause of that willing” (p. 144; cf. p. 139). In fact, Scotus seems to have thought just the opposite in his important text on the problem, on which his secretary and literary executor, William of Alnwick, later remarked. In 2 Ord. d. 34-37, Scotus entertains at some length the view that God is only the mediate cause of volition in the created will, so that God causes the will, but it remains the total cause of its own act. Although, as Alnwick observes in his remark, Scotus thinks this view has some merit, he ultimately rejects it as inconsistent with both divine omniscience and omnipotence. In the end, Scotus sides with the more common opinion that God is the immediate, partial co-cause of volition. (The issue of divine cooperation in volition is, of course, separate from the question of whether, within the rational creature, the will as opposed to the intellect is the total cause of volition, which Scotus takes up in another important text also remarked on by Alnwick.)

The Ross/Bates entry asserts that one of the “distinctive claims” of Scotus’s natural theology is that “… an a priori demonstration of the existence of God is impossible because there is nothing explanatorily prior to the divine being; thus, reasoning must be a posteriori from the real dependences among things we perceive … .” (p. 192). If a priori and a posteriori here refer to the Aristotelian notions of propter quid and quia demonstration respectively, then one of Scotus’s distinctive claims is much the opposite. Although Scotus agrees with Aquinas that in the present state there can only be a quia demonstration of God from effects, he disagrees with Aquinas that a strict propter quid or causal demonstration of God’s existence is impossible in principle, depending on what the term ’God’ signifies. Rather, Scotus claims that when the term ’God’ refers to any concept naturally available to us, such as infinite or necessary being, there can be a propter quid demonstration of the proposition ’God exists’ through the divine essence itself as a middle term. (Scotus holds that the created intellect can have a distinct knowledge of the divine essence short of beatitude, although obviously not through natural means.) In fact, the absolute possibility of such a propter quid demonstration is how Scotus argues against Aquinas that, when the term ’God’ goes for any naturally available concept, the proposition ’God exists’ is not only not self-evident to us but not even in itself, a distinction Scotus accordingly discards. This is a special case of Scotus’s very distinctive and radical conception of theology as a strict, propter quid science in itself, at least as regards necessary truths about God, a conception Ockham would later attack at length.

On the scholarly side, there are some slips and omissions in the introduction and front matter. Scotus’s Expositio or literal commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics is not lost (p. 9), but was uncovered by Giorgio Pini in 1996 and is now nearing publication. Scotus’s so-called Quaestio logica is not listed among his works, although King cites it (p. 60 n. 34). It is not clear how complete the list of translations on pp. xv-xvi is intended to be, but several large items are missing: 1 Lect. d. 39 (Vos), which is used by Ross/Bates, 2 Lect. d. 3 (Wolter), selections on the formal distinction from 1 Ord. d. 2, d. 8 and the Quaestio logica (Tweedale) and 4 Ord. d. 15 q. 2 (Wolter), among others. No mention is made of the nineteenth-century Vivès enlargement of the Wadding edition, although it is the more widely cited of the two.

As indicated, the volume contains substantial documentation in the endnotes. Their usefulness, in my view, has been diminished by the decision to refer to passages in Scotus’s works only by a general, internal citation without supplying either the edition of the work cited or a volume and page number. Given the complexity and unfamiliarity of Scotus’s corpus and the variation in internal organization between different editions, even for the same work, such a bare reference is often not enough for any but the expert to locate easily. The situation is aggravated because it is stipulated (pp. xiii-xiv) that the references will be given according to the Wadding, Vatican, or Bonaventure editions, depending on the work or part of a work cited – which of these editions is intended for any given reference the reader must already know or deduce from the introduction – but this is not applied to the Quodlibet and De primo principio. These are instead cited according to the paragraph numbers of Wolter’s more recent editions, not that of the older Wadding text. In short, Scotus’s works simply cannot be cited in the compressed manner of Aquinas’s Summa without confusion.

One final point of scholarship deserves mention. The volume contains references to inauthentic sections of the second book of the Ordinatio printed in the Wadding-Vivès edition, which sections include notably distinction 12 and all of distinctions 15-25 (cf. p. 60 n. 31; p. 66 nn. 89, 93; p. 67 nn. 97, 99, 100, 103, 105, 107; p. 280 n. 22; p. 281 nn. 28, 30, 31, 35-37, 39; p. 351 n. 32). The recently published critical edition of 2 Ordinatio omits these distinctions, among other material, as interpolations. The unfortunate state of Wadding’s text at these places has been known for some time, and ten years ago the modern editors gave a detailed listing of all authentic questions in Scotus’s commentaries on the Sentences for the first two books (ed. Vat. XIX.55*-73*). Even if in the present cases no mistaken point of exegesis hangs on the citation of these extraneous passages, nevertheless every precaution should have been taken to avoid propagating Wadding’s mistake, which has historically been the source of so much confusion and misinterpretation.

These complaints do not seriously jeopardize the overall quality of the book. Its extensive coverage, substantial detail, clear style and largely uniform approach ensure that it will be the standard entry into Scotus’s philosophy. It is an entry that students and generalists will likely find difficult, but this is perhaps unavoidable in a book on a most technical thinker of a most technical period. At the same time, there is certainly room for another replacement to Jean Duns Scot, one that would set Scotus and his thought more explicitly in the intellectual context of his period and step back from isolated results to bring an intellectual portrait of him into focus. This, of course, could only be the book of a single author, not thirteen, which probably explains why after more than fifty years it has yet to be written.