The Cambridge Companion to Early Modern Philosophy

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Donald Rutherford (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Early Modern Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 421pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN: 9780521529624.

Reviewed by Angela M. Coventry, Portland State University


The Cambridge Companion to Early Modern Philosophy is an impressive collection of twelve essays by leading scholars that serves as an "introduction and guide" to the most important developments in early modern philosophy, with an emphasis on the "transformation of concepts and doctrines inherited from ancient and medieval philosophy and the arguments used to justify these transformations" (xiii, 3). The intended audience includes not only students of philosophy and history, but also specialists. By offering "a fresh look at the philosophical thought of early modern Europe," the volume directs "the way toward more advanced studies in the field" (xiii, 1). This review provides a summary of the main contribution of the volume, a brief overview of each essay, and concludes with some evaluative remarks on the volume as a whole.

A specific aim of the collection is to reflect recent developments in the historical scholarship of the early modern period. Rutherford notes four such developments in the Introduction (1-4). The first is that early modern scholars no longer focus entirely on the major published works of its most famous figures. These days, scholars pave the way for a proper understanding of a canonical text by relating it to the author's entire body of written work, both published and unpublished, and by comparing it to works of the author's immediate predecessors and contemporaries. Second, the cast of leading characters that make up the canon of early modern philosophy has expanded considerably. In addition to the big seven -- Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz, Locke, Berkeley, Hume and Kant -- thinkers such as Grotius, Gassendi, Hobbes, Arnauld, Malebranche, Bayle, Pufendorf and Hutcheson -- to name just a few -- are now appreciated as significant figures in their own right. Third, there is a "growing skepticism" toward the "traditional interpretive categories" associated with the modern period, such as the distinction between the "empiricists" and "rationalists," which reflects a bias in the history of philosophy toward metaphysics and epistemology and away from ethics and political philosophy (3). Fourth, the advancement of early modern philosophy has been recognized as inseparable from the changes in the intellectual and cultural climate of the period, such as the development of natural science, the religious conflicts within and between Catholic and Protestant churches, and the rise of the modern nation state. To reflect these developments, the book is divided by areas of inquiry rather than by individual philosophers.

The first essay, "Innovation and orthodoxy in early modern philosophy" by Rutherford, calls for two qualifications of the traditional picture that early modern philosophy makes a radical break with the past due to groundbreaking developments in science. Rutherford argues that this picture encourages the belief that the innovations in the period were primarily in metaphysics and epistemology, which misses the development of moral and political philosophy.  For it would be a "gross simplification" to see every innovation in moral and political philosophy as a consequence of the developments in science given the background theological and political conflicts (14). Furthermore, scholarship has shown that many philosophers in the period remain tied to the ideas and arguments of their predecessors. Not to mention that many early modern philosophers, such as Descartes, attempted to understand the innovations of the new scientific world-view in a manner compatible with religious teachings in much the same way as almost all of Aristotle's natural philosophy was accommodated by the theology of the medieval period. Exceptions include thinkers like Spinoza, who challenged the traditional theistic conception of God in his philosophy of nature and human society.

The next two essays are devoted to the seventeenth century transformation of the methods and concepts in natural philosophy. In "Knowledge, evidence and method," Stephen Gaukroger emphasizes that method was a "practical, pressing question" that got the scientific enterprise going in the first place (40). The search for a satisfactory method yielded "several different novel methodological models" determined by "two sets of factors" (39). First, questions about method tie to developments in natural philosophy itself, to the relation between natural philosophy and other disciplines, and to concerns about the intellectual skills required to practice natural philosophy.  Second, questions about the right sort of method for scientific disciplines translate into questions about the "legitimation" of the entire scientific enterprise (39). Gaukroger shows how these concerns come together at "certain crucial junctures," shaping "core methodological questions" in his examination of Bacon, Galileo and Descartes against the backdrop of Aristotle's doctrine of method and its revival in the Renaissance (39). There are two parts to Dennis Des Chene's essay, "From natural philosophy to natural science." First, he details the transformation of the Aristotelian-influenced doctrine of scholastic matter and form. Scholastic matter turned into mechanical matter, elementary particles of matter; and form was made over into figure, the shapes of the parts of matter, and texture, the various manners of combination of the parts of matter. All natural phenomena were explained in terms of these particles endowed with only a few primary qualities, with the sensible so-called "secondary qualities," such as color, taste and odor, being the result of the impact of the primary qualities on sensory organs. Second, Des Chene considers the transformation of the scholastic distinction between chance and ends into a distinction between chance and causal laws. The laws were only the fundamental laws of motion at first, but the notion was gradually extended to cover almost any universal generalization, until "'science' and 'knowledge of laws' become, as in Kant, virtually identical" (68).

Metaphysics, mind and logic take up the next three chapters. In "Metaphysics," Nicholas Jolley shows the ancient and scholastic holdovers in the systems of early modern philosophers on matters such as substance, mind, causality, and space and time. His essay covers those philosophers who infused "radically new content" into much of the "rich metaphysical vocabulary and set of categories from the ancient and medieval world," as well as those philosophers who were skeptical about the use of the traditional set of categories in the practice of metaphysics, and those who were skeptical of the whole metaphysical enterprise in general (95-96). Essay five, "The science of mind" by Tad Schmaltz, challenges the view that Descartes's theory of mind makes knowledge of what exists outside the mind problematic. Against the background of the Aristotelian and scholastic soul, Schmaltz details the development of Descartes's theory of the mind and explains with great clarity how it influenced his early modern successors by way of topics of the mind-body problem, ideas, innatism, the will, freedom, and determinism. What emerges is that Descartes is more concerned with presenting a "new metaphysical conception of the mind" and less concerned with epistemological problems to do with external world skepticism (136-37). The next essay "Language and logic" by Michael Losonsky, contends that the era of early modern logic is packed full of "drama and excitement," contrary to the view that logic as a subject matter was on the decline in the seventeenth century (170). His essay examines two turns: the mathematical, the transformation of traditional logic into modern mathematical logic; and the linguistic, a turn toward natural language for answers to philosophical questions and problems.

The next two chapters cover ethics. In essay seven, "The passions and the good life," Susan James details how, as in classical and medieval theories, the traditional image of the opposition between reason and passion dominated early modern discussions about the ethical value of our emotions. During the course of the seventeenth century, the notion of a passion was "progressively reconfigured" and "accounts of psychological conditions on which virtue depended acquired an even greater complexity" (200). Opposing the common position that passions ought to be controlled by reason, writers in the eighteenth century put forward "a new conception of good character, no longer so focused on the careful control of passion, but hospitable to the spontaneous expression of sentiment" (218). The next essay, Stephen Darwall's "The foundations of morality: virtue, law, and obligation," is a reminder that the ideas referred to by terms like 'morality,' 'moral law' and 'moral agent' in early modern thought comprise together "a way of thinking about a significant part of ethics" that is still prevalent today (222). In his wide-ranging essay, Darwall explores the early modern natural law tradition of Grotius and his contemporaries, including Pufendorf, Hobbes and Locke, comparing it to the background of the classical natural law tradition of Aquinas and his followers. He then shows how critical reactions to the natural law tradition led to new approaches in ethics, such as ethical rationalism as developed by thinkers such as Cudworth, Malebranche, Spinoza and Leibniz, and moral sentimentalism of the sort developed by Hutcheson and Hume. 

Political philosophy is the subject of essay nine, "Theories of the state" by A. John Simmons. Simmons examines two interrelated divides or transitions in the early modern period. The first concerns a theoretical distinction between political naturalism, that it is part of the nature of human beings that they are political, and political antinaturalism, that the natural condition of humankind is nonpolitical. The second is the historical transition from political societies that existed as "complex, hierarchical structures of overlapping religious and contractual relationships" to political societies that "take the form of modern, sovereign, territorial states" (250). Seeing how these transitions take place is no small matter since the theories advanced by early modern political philosophers played an integral role in the development of the political institutions familiar to us today. In the next essay, "Theology and the God of the philosophers," Thomas M. Lennon focuses on two important developments in early modern thought about God. The first is that philosophers of the period "reveal less about God than about themselves, or at least about the world as they see it" (275). The idea is that all agree on what attributes God possesses but certain attributes are emphasized over others depending upon the philosopher at hand; for example, Leibniz stresses wisdom, while Descartes emphasizes power. The second development is that it became increasingly unnecessary to have recourse to God to explain the world and humanity. By the turn of the eighteenth century, deism emerged as the dominant doctrine and God's role was that of an 'absentee landlord' who does not intervene in the world beyond what was necessary to create it in the first place. It is a short step "logically and historically" from deism to atheism (277).

In essay eleven, "Scholastic schools and early modern philosophy," M. W. F. Stone successfully debunks the traditional view that scholasticism is "largely irrelevant to the study of early modern thought" by showing that a large part of philosophical activity from the sixteenth century up to the time of Kant was due to early modern scholastics (299). Stone provides an illuminating "provisional cartography" of scholastic schools and thinkers in the early modern period that details how these scholastic thinkers approached philosophy by the "needs and exigencies" of their own times even as they drew inspiration from the medieval period (301). The final essay in the volume, J. B. Schneewind's "Toward enlightenment: Kant and the sources of darkness," concerns, fittingly enough, the end of early modern philosophy to Kant. Schneewind compares Kant with his predecessors, particularly Spinoza, Locke, Holbach and Hume, on the lack of enlightenment. The lack of enlightenment for Kant's predecessors results from "cognitive failure of one sort or another," so enlightenment calls for "improvement in our theoretical grasp of the world" by clarifying ideas, improving reasoning or increasing scientific knowledge (347). For Kant, lack of enlightenment is the "failure of courage to use our own reason," which is a "moral failure of the will," so enlightenment calls for people to be given the freedom to use their own intellect and recommends a republican form of government as "best suited to the express our essential moral freedom" (346-48). The volume ends with short biographies of the major figures of the period and a comprehensive bibliography of both primary and secondary sources.

All of the essays are excellent and informative, establishing this volume as undoubtedly the best collection of essays on early modern philosophy to date. The volume succeeds both in presenting central issues and important developments in early modern philosophy with clarity and rigor, and in showcasing the new developments in the scholarship of the early modern period by the way of prominent scholars. The situation of early modern thought in relation to ancient and medieval philosophy does much to illuminate the period, and we even gain insight into how early modern philosophy influenced subsequent philosophy. Moreover, all of the essays are written at a level that makes them both challenging to the expert and accessible to students and non-experts in the field. In short, the volume is an absolute must-have for students of philosophy, history and specialists of the period.

While the volume covers a remarkably wide range of topics and thinkers in the early modern period, there are limitations, of course. No doubt space constraints naturally preclude the inclusion of all of those topics the editor might have wished to include. A welcome addition to the volume would be a chapter on skepticism, which was a popular and important philosophical issue in the early modern period, particularly amongst such thinkers as Montaigne, Gassendi, Charron, Glanvill, Pascal, Descartes, Bayle and Hume. Rutherford notes in his essay that the revival of ancient skepticism in the early sixteenth century is one of the major forces in the development of modern thought, especially when it comes to the nature of knowledge and the sciences (19). This has been well-documented by Richard Popkin in his influential work The History of Skepticism from Erasmus to Spinoza (1979), which revealed the importance of skeptical arguments for the early moderns in the demolition of traditional scholastic conceptions of science, allowing for new developments in scientific method. The exact nature of the relationship between ancient and early modern forms of skepticism remains controversial in the secondary literature, and a new treatment of this topic in the volume would have been helpful for scholars and students alike.

Discussion of topics such as personal identity and abstraction would also be welcome additions given the framework of the volume. The issue of personal identity was of special importance for many early modern philosophers such as Hobbes, Boyle, Descartes, Locke, Leibniz and Hume. Concerns about personal identity are particularly pressing because they relate to theological issues such as life after death, not to mention questions to do with moral responsibility such as pride or guilt, reward or punishment for past actions, and rights based on previous actions or possession. This is a fitting topic for the present volume because the early modern debate about personal identity is rooted in medieval philosophy. In fact, a major part of the background for early modern discussion on personal identity was informed by medieval disputes on the topic of the search for a principle of individuation, the question about what it is that makes an individual, whether it be object or person, the individual it is and what distinguishes it from other individuals. Locke for example intends his theory about the identity of persons to contrast with scholastic (and Cartesian) theories. When it comes to abstract or general ideas, the common story has it that Berkeley heavily criticized Locke's explanation of the formation of abstract ideas in addition to presenting his own positive account of how abstract ideas are formed -- an account which was enthusiastically endorsed and taken over by Hume. This is a suitable topic for the volume because Locke's explanation of how general ideas are formed out of particular ones is suggestive of most medieval accounts since Boethius, while Berkeley's critique of Locke, as well as his own positive account as to how abstract ideas are formed, draws on ideas from important medieval philosophers such as Scotus and Ockham. The debate between Locke and Berkeley on abstraction is a matter of some interpretive difficulty, so a new handling of the topic treating it in relation to the disputes between medieval philosophers would be another very useful addition to the volume.

Revealing these gaps in the volume merely indicates some important issues in early modern scholarship that might inspire future research. The Cambridge Companion to Early Modern Philosophy succeeds in supplying an admirable model for the future of early modern scholarship, one that will help to answer many questions as well as to stimulate many more about this very fruitful period of philosophy.