The Cambridge Companion to Einstein

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Michel Janssen and Christoph Lehner (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Einstein, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 562pp., $36.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521535427.

Reviewed by Amit Hagar, Indiana University, Bloomington


This long expected volume, edited by two former Einstein's Papers Project senior editors and researchers, presents 14 essays on Albert Einstein's scholarship. Written by some of the leading Einstein scholars, philosophers and historians, these essay encompass Einstein's annus mirabilis: the development of the general theory of relativity, his contribution to relativistic cosmology, his views on quantum theory, his philosophical and methodological legacies, and his ideas on politics. Striking a perfect balance between accessibility and serious scholarship, it is a welcome contribution to the vast literature on Einstein and his work and can also serve as a gentle introduction to Einstein's remarkable career and its impact on the physics and the philosophy of science of the 20th Century.

Michel Janssen and Christoph Lehner have carefully chosen to present Einstein's work from a myriad of perspectives. The final picture that arises from reading the essays -- and these can be read in any order -- is a coherent blend of the historical and the philosophical contexts that help the reader understand Einstein's contributions and his role as one of the few superstar scientists in the history of mankind. The Cambridge Companion Series has mostly been dedicated to the humanities, with a few exceptions such as Bacon, Galileo, Newton and Darwin. This companion to Einstein does justice to his place in our culture and his impact thereon.

The book opens with a concise introduction that weaves the essays into Einstein's biography, emphasizing his major intellectual achievements. It provides a useful overview of the essays. 10 of these are on Einstein's physics, 3 on his philosophy of science, and 1 on his politics. Among the many ways in which Einstein's work could be presented, the editors have chosen to focus on several principles that Einstein scholars believe have guided his work. I deliberately say "believe" because Einstein's own testimonies on the principles that guided his work are sometimes hard to reconcile, and a significant part of the scholarship on him is dedicated to making sense, or "rationalizing" his methodology. This is the case with his attitude towards the mathematics that accompanied his special theory of relativity. Einstein is sometimes criticized for his distaste of quantum theory, in spite of his being one of its originators, and for his "rigid adherence" to field theory that worked so well with the general theory of relativity and not so well with his later quest for a unified field theory.

The first five essays concern Einstein's annus mirabilis, the year 1905 in which, in addition to his dissertation, Einstein published four papers that changed physics forever. In hindsight, this change is recognized as so dramatic that Jürgen Renn and Robert Rynasiewicz, authors of the first essay, call it "a Copernican revolution". They explain in the simplest terms what Einstein achieved in the four papers, and how he arrived at them. Their essay, along with the one following it on the special theory of relativity (STR), by John Norton, another Einstein luminary, place Einstein's contributions in a historical context, which makes the 1905 articles appear all the more impressive. The reader may be acquainted with the forerunners of STR, (e.g., Lorentz, Poincaré) and with the path that took Einstein from his considerations of Maxwell's electrodynamics, through the relativity of simultaneity, and into the structure of spacetime that we now call Minkowski. Relying on Einstein's well-researched archives, Norton, as well as Renn and Rynaseiwicz, make it clear that it was ingenious of him to focus on anomalies that his contemporaries and predecessors were unable to reconcile with the pre-relativistic world picture, to rethink that world picture -- transforming it by weaving space and time into one unity.

The third essay on Einstein's annus mirabilis deals with his contributions to statistical physics. A. J. Kox discusses the context in which Einstein's Ph.D. dissertation, as well as his paper on Brownian motion, were conceived, and emphasizes Einstein's belief in atomism. Kox traces Einstein's route to statistical physics to two papers he published in 1901-1902 where he combined thermodynamic arguments with kinetic theoretical assumptions on molecular forces in order to obtain experimentally verifiable results. This type of scholarship and method continued with Einstein's Ph.D. dissertation, in which he calculated Avogadro's number, and with the famous paper on Brownian motion, which led to a series of papers on the subject. Kox mentions that the success of Einstein's methods led to experimental verifications of his calculations, and played a major role in convincing skeptics, e.g., Wilhelm Ostwald (but not Mach), about the reality of atoms and molecules.

One of Einstein's most fruitful insights in statistical mechanics was his reasoning about fluctuations, which he also applied in his paper on the photoelectric effect and light quanta. Olivier Darrigol presents the history behind that paper in the fourth essay. Darrigol's is perhaps the most iconoclastic of the essays; he dispels several perpetuated myths about who introduced discreteness into modern physics. Carefully delineating the chronology, Darrigol demonstrates that Planck who is usually credited with introducing discreteness on the basis of his 1900 paper on blackbody radiation, was not at all committed at that time to the physical significance of his result, and was deterred by his disbelief in a completely dynamical underpinning of thermodynamics. It was Einstein who tackled the problem with the bold hypothesis of light quanta, and, as Planck himself acknowledges in his autobiography, should receive credit for it. As Darrigol notes, Einstein's affirmative role in this context is also evident in the words of his close friend, Besso, who advised him against taking issue with Planck in print: "in the years 1904 and 1905 I was your public. If in connection with the drafting of your papers on the quantum problems, I deprived you of a part of your fame, in return I secured a friend for you in Planck" (124).

Although Einstein has pointed at three physical phenomena that could be used to test his light quanta hypothesis, it took almost 18 years to settle the question and remove all doubts. The final, fifth essay on Einstein's annus mirabilis concerns this winding road to the realization of the scientific community that light quanta were a reality. In it Roger Stuewer, the historian of physics, tells the incredible tale of the experimental challenges to light quanta, and the villains and heroes who were the challengers. Millikan is one of the villians. According to Stuewer, Millikan had the habit of changing the history to suit him, and appears to have operated under the maxim "if the facts don't fit your theory, change the facts"! Compton, on the other hand, as well as Stark, are the heroes. Stark was the only physicist siding with Einstein as early as 1909, while Compton had painstakingly worked in complete autonomy for 7 years, until in 1924 the effect that received his name and that verified Einstein's hypothesis came to be accepted as a natural fact.

Following these gems of papers by Darrigol and Stuewer are three essays on Einstein's general theory of relativity (GTR). In the first Michel Janssen gently leads the reader with a masterful hand through Einstein's quest for the field equations. Accompanying his text by vivid illustrations, he depicts this quest as an attempt to vindicate Mach's principle. Janssen  shows that although this attempt failed from one perspective it was successful from another: while GTR doesn't eliminate absolute motion, it does support a relational interpretation of spacetime ontology. Janssen's brilliant essay is a demonstration of how the failure of one thesis (relativism) explains the success of another (relationalism), and is an example of history and philosophy of science at its best. The lesson from Einstein's quest is clear: when in doubts about your philosophy, check your physics!

One of the consequences of GTR was that it helped create a new discipline in physics, namely, relativistic cosmology. Christopher Smeenk describes this role in his essay. He continues Janssen's theme on Mach's principle's remaining unfulfilled within GTR, and explains the background for the introduction of what Einstein called "his biggest blunder", namely, Lambda, the cosmological constant. Here I have two minor qualms, one over inclusion and another over omission. First, Smeenk devotes a full section to what he calls "the great debate" at the beginning of the 20th century between astronomers and cosmologists on cosmogony and galactic clustering. Yet this section seems completely irrelevant to the post-relativistic era, and, as Smeenk notes, Einstein himself was not motivated at all by these problems and controversies, but rather by the Machian ideas described in Janssen's essay. My other qualm is that the discussion on singularities focuses solely on Einstein's response to De Sitter, and completely ignores the famous paper by Einstein and Rosen from 1936, where the two attempted to show that a gravitational wave solution to GTR field equations would lead to unacceptable singularities.

Daniel J. Kennefick, in the next essay on gravitational waves, does mention the Einstein-Rosen collaboration, and rightly so, as the story behind that paper and its refereeing process is oft told as an opening anecdote to many Einstein's talks. The year was 1936, and P. Robertson was the referee for the Physical Review, who in winter of that year had rejected the paper by Einstein and Rosen (for the right reasons). In spring the two sent the paper without any changes to another journal, but in the following winter finally revised it (even its title) in line with suggestions from Robertson, which may have been communicated to them by Leopold Infeld, who learned from Robertson about the matter several months earlier. The essay continues to spell out the reasons for Einstein's change of opinion about gravitational waves in the course of his career, and concludes that the kind of reasoning that made him so famous, namely, reasoning from analogy, could sometimes be very tricky. Yet regardless of whether the analogy between electromagnetic and gravitational waves works, Einstein should be credited for being the first to articulate it in 1918.

The next two essays concern Einstein's later career. Tilman Sauer focuses on Einstein's obsession with the quest for a unified field theory. The puzzle this quest poses to a historian of physics is well known: Einstein pursued it with steadfast conviction despite many disappointments, in over-increasing scientific isolation, but to no avail. Sauer approaches this quest from many different perspectives, conceptual, representational, biographical, and philosophical with the hope of showing that a full appreciation of these dimensions is necessary for the proper resolution of the historical puzzle. The Einstein who emerges from these investigations is someone who believed strongly in the capability of a single human mind to grasp the mysteries of nature in a simple form, and that rigidly adhered to the concept of the field.

This belief may as well be at the heart of Einstein's distaste of quantum mechanics (QM), which is the subject of the next essay, by Christoph Lehner. Like many before him, Lehner has his own hypothesis about the reasons behind Einstein's views on QM. Was it realism? Determinism? Separability? Or was it the rigid adherence to the field concept and to the idea that physics should describe separable physical systems as continuously evolving in spacetime, as Einstein testified to Schilpp in his biography from 1949,? Regardless of what the answer turns out to be, the famous Einstein-Bohr debate on the completeness of QM and the EPR argument remain two of the most fruitful topics for discussions on the foundations of physics.

The next three essays deal with Einstein's philosophy, in particular his philosophy of science. Don Howard elaborates on his view that Einstein is one of the most important philosophers of science in the 20th century. Howard points out that Einstein's philosophy emerged from his encounters with the logical empiricists of the 1920s. Both Einstein and the logical empiricists sought a new empiricist response to the neo-Kantian critique of GTR, and it this context in which most of Einstein's philosophical ideas are expressed. For example, in his review of a book on Kant and relativity one finds a clear statement on the empirical content of GTR, which favors a Duhemian holism. This context, says Howard, may explain Einstein's self-portrayal as an "epistemological opportunist", and may be the most important factor shaping the development of logical empiricism. Yet, as Howard makes clear, the context should not mislead us: logical empiricism was more than a philosophy of relativity, and Einstein's philosophy was more than a reply to Kant. Constrained as he is by the scope of the volume, Howard refers his readers to additional sources on the fascinating topic of Einstein's scientific methodology.

Thomas Ryckman gives us another angle on Einstein and Kant, and traces the development of Einstein's ideas on the debate between rationalism and empiricism (as well as its Kantian resolution) from the "Machian" inception of GTR to the later conviction that while experience alone remains the ultimate arbiter, it is still methodologically and logically "kosher" to believe in the comprehensibility of reality. This conviction is what Ryckman suggests Einstein called "the truly valuable in Kant", namely, that the very concept of order of nature presupposes the decision to seek unity in science through systematic connections. Despite the fact that the volume's essays can be read in any order, I recommend reading this one after having read most of its predecessors, as it may give a whole new perspective on the issues they discuss.

The final essay on Einstein's philosophy is Michael Friedman's. Friedman elaborates on his masterful treatment of Einstein's "Geometry and Experience" (Ch. 8, Reading Natural Philosophy, edited by D. Malament, Open Court, 2002), which readers might want to get acquainted with beforehand. The present essay analyzes Einstein's contributions to the philosophy of geometry concluding that the conceptual foundations of geometry can no longer be fruitfully pursued independently of the problem of motion. Physical geometry poses the same problem of the unity of spacetime. Those versed in the development of quantum gravity (where the issue shifts from the Euclidean/non-Euclidean character of physical geometry to its continuous/discrete character) couldn't agree more.

The concluding essay, by Robert Schulmann, is on Einstein's politics. Schulmann's aim is to explain the identification of Einstein as a person of integrity in the political sphere.  He ties this explanation to Einstein's moral roots, emphasizing that Einstein's views should be seen as moral stances rather than particular political commitments. This interesting essay provides another perspective on Einstein's life using the historical context of the Holocaust, the rise of the state of Israel, and the McCarthy era in the U.S.

In sum, this is a well-written, accessible, and valuable book on Einstein's legacy. The essays and the informative and gracefully illustrated appendix (providing the uninitiated with gentle access to the nuts and bolts of STR) complement each other. They depict a coherent and cohesive portrait of Einstein as one of the few intellectual giants in the history of science. The volume should appeal to anyone interested in the physics of the 20th century and in its development.