The Cambridge Companion to Gadamer

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Dostal, Robert J. (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Gadamer, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 332pp, $23.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521000416.

Reviewed by Taylor Carman, Barnard College, Columbia University


Few thinkers have exerted as deep and as wide an influence on contemporary philosophy, social theory, and the humanities as Hans-Georg Gadamer, who died in March, 2002, at the age of 102, just a month before the publication of this collection of essays. His life was nearly coterminous with the century, and his thought coincided with many of the deepest and most pressing philosophical problems of late modernity. Above all, Gadamer posed striking questions, and suggested provocative answers, concerning the authority of theoretical reason and the natural sciences over against everyday understanding and humanistic research, and more generally concerning the conditions and prospects of understanding others across historical and cultural distances.

Gadamer was enormously learned, but his studies of ancient philosophy in particular bear out the systematic aims of his “philosophical hermeneutics,” insisting as it does on the essential situatedness of human understanding, the primacy of dialogical over textual meaning, the need for conversational reciprocity and openness to other points of view, and the normative demand for an integration or “fusion” of horizons. Catherine Zuckert’s essay on Gadamer’s readings of Plato and Aristotle provides an informative and illuminating account of the evolution in Gadamer’s approach to ancient thought, the salient details in his interpretations of key texts, and the problems that seem to emerge from his tendency to assimilate perspectives rather than draw sharp battle lines. Not only does Gadamer make Plato look like both a Socratic, dialogical moralist and an Aristotelian advocate of practical wisdom (phronesis), he also sees Aristotle as having anticipated the late modern predicament in which we seem to have lost confidence in any form of understanding that does not aim either directly or indirectly at the measurement, manipulation, and exploitation of its objects. Gadamer teaches us not to master, but to listen to and learn from the texts we read, and moreover to do so unapologetically from the only interpretive perspective open to us, namely our own. This mixture of urgency and attentiveness is what gives his hermeneutical studies their freshness and relevance, but it sometimes seems to rest on an arbitrary preference for harmony and agreement over difference and inconsistency.

Gadamer’s relation to his modern predecessors and contemporaries is a rather more complicated affair. What many people know about Gadamer, if they know little else, is that he was a student of Heidegger’s and that his work is in many ways a continuation of Heidegger’s hermeneutic reorientation of phenomenology. Jean Grondin’s contribution to the volume sheds considerable light on the similarities and differences between Heidegger’s and Gadamer’s conceptions of understanding and interpretation. (Unfortunately, a misprint that reverses the two words in a chart on page 49 may mislead readers already struggling to get a grip on those concepts.) Fred Lawrence also offers an informative survey of the hermeneutical and theological ideas that shaped Gadamer’s philosophical development, and Robert Dostal’s introduction and his paper on Gadamer’s relation to Heidegger will be useful for those wanting to know more about the formative influences on Gadamer’s thought. These three papers make it clear that while philosophical hermeneutics is unthinkable outside the context of fundamental ontology, Heidegger never warmly embraced Gadamer’s work. Conversely, Gadamer remained dissatisfied with Heidegger’s violent readings of past philosophers, with his notion that Western philosophy had come to an end, and with his subsequent reliance on poetic, even mystical language as an alternative to the grammar and the vocabulary of metaphysics. There is, moreover, an unmistakable normative thrust to Gadamer’s notions of interpretive openness and the fusion of horizons, while Heidegger’s thinking always remained far removed from anything resembling ethical discourse.

Georgia Warnke and Charles Taylor take up the ethical thread that runs through Gadamer’s work, but with somewhat mixed results. Warnke argues convincingly against Habermas’s attempt to reconstruct a minimal rational foundation for the universal demands of morality, over and beyond the ethical values we might be lucky enough to have inherited from our cultural past. Following Gadamer and Michael Walzer, Warnke insists that such “thin” conceptions of morality seem persuasive only to the extent that they smuggle in “thick” values that are not at all deducible from reason, or from the formal structure of communication, but are grounded in rich and complex cultural traditions. Warnke also pleads eloquently on behalf of a genuine openness to others, to their values and self-understandings, which often diverge so sharply from our own. It is easy to embrace such an ideal of sensitivity and reciprocity – perhaps all too easy. For what real normative force does the idea of interpretive openness carry with it? Does it always point to a compromise position above or beyond values in conflict? Warnke suggests that “what impedes resolution of debates over euthanasia, abortion, and the like is a lack of hermeneutic sensitivity and openness” (96). Perhaps, but the abortion debate in particular seems to afford no middle ground. Either you believe that abortion violates the rights of the fetus, or you do not. It is hard to see how any further openness or engagement with religious values so deeply hostile to the bodily autonomy of women is going to ameliorate the conflict between those who favor criminalizing abortion and those who oppose it. Warnke is likewise too sanguine, it seems to me, in supposing that a hermeneutically sensitive democratic practice will reconcile value conflicts simply because, for instance, the “multiplicity of meanings excludes racist and sexist possibilities” (100). This makes the struggles for civil rights and gender equality look much easier in retrospect than they were in fact, even conceptually, for it was far from obvious to everyone, even to most people, fifty years ago that mere open-mindedness required federal laws prohibiting racial discrimination and sexual harassment.

Charles Taylor makes a somewhat more modest claim for the practical import of Gadamer’s ideal of interpretive openness, maintaining only that “in coming to see the other correctly, we inescapably alter our understanding of ourselves” (140). We cannot expect a better understanding of others and a deeper understanding of ourselves to eliminate disagreement and conflict altogether, then, though they may well diminish unnecessary ignorance and insensitivity. But mere openness is no panacea. Taylor also touches on a question that frequently arises for those who read Gadamer from the standpoint of analytic philosophy, namely, how far does the concept of a fusion of interpretive horizons approximate Donald Davidson’s principle of interpretive charity? Taylor acknowledges a basic similarity between the two notions, but he insists on the superiority of Gadamer’s position, which demands continual recognition of the otherness of other perspectives, even as it denies the possibility of a point of view totally alien and hence unintelligible to us. Davidson’s argument is too strong, Taylor argues, since it famously abolishes the very idea of conceptual schemes, and with it the possibility of acknowledging perspectives deeply unlike ours. Interpreting others with an eye to maximizing the truth of their beliefs and the rationality of their actions by our lights alone might well mean assimilating their world to ours in implausible and even damaging ways.

Brice Wachterhauser likewise contrasts Davidson’s coherentism and his rejection of realism with Gadamer’s insistence that the intelligibility of other perspectives is not merely dependent on or relative to the interpretive resources of our own. But Wachterhauser draws his inspiration from John McDowell, who is concerned with problems of intentionality and empirical content quite generally, whereas Gadamer is interested more specifically in mutual understanding and textual interpretation, which he insists are radically unlike our theoretical knowledge of objects. The comparison with McDowell thus leads Wachterhauser to attribute to Gadamer a robust metaphysical realism that seems in tension with his regular reminders of the difference between theoretical objectivity and hermeneutical understanding. Perhaps this tension springs from the obscurity of the oft-cited pronouncement in Truth and Method that “Being that can be understood is language.” Does Gadamer himself take the “book of nature” metaphor seriously, or does he mean only that language mediates our understanding of nature, and yet that natural objects and texts have a fundamentally different hermeneutic status?

Richard Bernstein offers a brief survey of the interconnections among hermeneutics, critical theory, and deconstruction, concluding – in an eminently Gadamerian spirit of reconciliation and compromise – that one ought not to feel forced to choose between them, for each approach “takes on a more poignant significance when we view them as forming a new constellation with both affinities and differences, attractions, and repulsions” (281).

Some conceptual choices are unavoidable, however, and Robert Pippin comes closer than any of the other contributors, it seems to me, to identifying one of the deepest and most pressing dilemmas to emerge in late modern European philosophy. His essay examines Gadamer’s complex and ambiguous relation to Hegel. Gadamer followed Heidegger in his rejection of subjectivism, which he thought defined not just the Cartesian-Kantian tradition, but also Hegelian rationalism and Romantic hermeneutics. Pippin maintains that a dialectic between Heidegger’s notion of being-in-the-world and a contrasting concept of critical, reflective subjectivity “was already clearly announced by and explored by Hegel” (226).

I think it is misleading to say that Hegel anticipated the Heideggerian idea, for the dialectic in the Phenomenology amounts precisely to a denial of Heidegger’s central point, namely, that individual finitude is constitutive of human existence. Nor is there any reason for Pippin to minimize Heidegger’s originality, for Pippin’s argument is precisely a defense of the Hegelian position over against Heidegger’s alternative conception. Whereas Heidegger and Gadamer insist that we can never achieve full self-conscious transparency about the historical and social conditions of our own understanding, Pippin counters that one cannot

just be “carrying on,” at some level unavailable to reflective consciousness, the practices and rules of a community life. In Hegel’s account, there is no such level unavailable to reflective life or the activity could not count as an activity belonging to us, and therein lies the deepest disagreement between Gadamer and Hegel (233).

This last observation is correct: the difference between the idealist and the existential standpoints hinges on the possibility of full rational comprehension of the contents and conditions of our own understanding. Pippin continues:

Gadamer was so concerned to limit the pretensions of a “reflective philosophy” and so to insist on a kind of embeddedness and inheritance not redeemable “reflectively” … that the curious, uniquely modern phenomenon first noticed with such brilliance by Rousseau is difficult to discuss in his terms. One can … come to understand and especially to experience virtually all of one’s inheritance, tradition, life-world, and so forth, as coherent and intelligible but not “one’s own,” and so as, root and branch, alien (238).

But the experience of anxiety and alienation is precisely what Heidegger brought to our philosophical attention again, not in order to confirm the radical autonomy of the subject over against the objects of its understanding, but to highlight our embeddedness in the world, which we can never grasp or spell out in purely rational terms. The Heidegger-Gadamer argument is not, as Pippin says, that “I cannot rightly be said to be consulting the rules of play and/or reflectively ‘applying’ them in practice” (239), but that at bottom there are no rules guiding our practices; it is rather the normativity of practice that guides us in the application of rules.

In insisting that practice is at bottom normative but not rule-governed, Heidegger and Gadamer can agree with Hegel and Pippin that our practices are “minded,” if that means intelligent and circumspective, as opposed to blindly mechanistic. But none of this, it seems to me, vindicates the subjectivist account of intelligibility, which is still very much alive in Hegel and which Pippin himself articulates so clearly, according to which the norms guiding practice must always be critically accessible to the agents caught up in them. As Pippin puts the point, alluding to Davidson’s coherentism, which in effect insulates the rational contents of our beliefs from any nonrational elements in our experience or understanding, “the game we are playing with norms always involves a possible interrogation about reasons for holding such norms, and … only such reasons can ‘determine’ our commitment to norms (or only beliefs can determine other beliefs)” (241).

But why should we believe that it is always possible to identify and articulate rational foundations for the practices we find sensible and good, and why must our commitments ultimately be vindicated or “determined” by such foundations? Pippin seems to suppose that our “uniquely modern” experience of alienation and self-conscious reflection itself confirms the ontological interpretation of human being as radically autonomous agency, whether individual or collective. But our modern self-conception no more validates that subjectivist ontology than the medieval experience of the sacred proved the existence of God. What Gadamer is urging is that we come to recognize the historical peculiarity and contingency of our self-understanding, however blindingly self-evident it may seem to us at the moment. Hegel, one is tempted to say, learned that lesson extraordinarily well for past ages, but not for his own.