The Cambridge Companion to Hegel and Nineteenth-Century Philosophy

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Frederick C. Beiser (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Hegel and Nineteenth-Century Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 518pp., $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521539388.

Reviewed by Robert M. Wallace,


Fred Beiser has edited a successor volume to the original Cambridge Companion to Hegel (1993). The contributions are all brand new, and many of them explore areas in Hegel that were treated poorly or not at all in the original Companion, including Hegel's philosophy of religion, his philosophy of nature (the subject of three first-rate essays here), his aesthetics (two essays), and his relation to hermeneutics and to mysticism. The title is quite misleading; the book deals only with Hegel and his immediate predecessors and contemporaries. As with many Cambridge Companions, the book isn't really designed for beginners. For students who have some relevant background, and for scholars, the book is a very high quality collection covering quite a lot of what a comprehensive volume on Hegel should cover. It omits only a couple of what I take to be key topics, which I'll touch on below.

To allow for a connected discussion with a bit of depth, I'll consider only seven of the book's fifteen papers, plus Fred Beiser's Introduction ("The Puzzling Hegel Renaissance"), in which he discusses the general picture of Hegel scholarship in recent years. Actually Beiser says that the "apex" of the recent "renaissance" was the publication over thirty years ago of Charles Taylor's Hegel (1975). Taylor presented Hegel as an ambitious metaphysician. But most Anglophone Hegel commentators since then, as Beiser describes, have avoided this approach. They have either addressed parts of Hegel's system that seem to be separable from his metaphysical project, or they have suggested that his basic project wasn't really metaphysical at all. Beiser doubts that the latter approach is defensible. But he himself seems to have no stomach for metaphysics. He speaks of it as something that "we" contemporary philosophers can't relate to "our concerns." If this is so, then the "renaissance" is indeed puzzling! Unless people are simply "antiquarians" -- an extreme possibility that Beiser mentions -- it's difficult to understand why they would invest years of work in a philosopher whose central efforts don't speak at all to their own concerns.[1]

It's worth noting that this anxiety about "metaphysics" seems to be more of an issue for Hegel commentators, today, than it is for specialists in Plato, Aristotle, medieval philosophy, Descartes, Leibniz or Spinoza. Is the latter group, then, composed of "antiquarians," who don't care whether the philosophers whom they study speak to their own concerns? Perhaps, on the contrary, they feel that Kant wasn't necessarily fully fair in stigmatizing his (non-empiricist) forebears as "dogmatic," and that we should give those forebears a more sympathetic hearing before making up our minds on the subject. Whereas Hegel commentators, who aren't dealing with Kant's forebears directly, are still scared silly by the stigma that Kant and his successors have attached to "metaphysics."

The new Companion in fact contains quite a number of papers that speak to this important issue, in ways to which Beiser (oddly) doesn't draw our attention. First, Paul Franks's "Ancient Skepticism, Modern Naturalism, and Nihilism in Hegel's Early Jena Writings" offers a highly suggestive interpretation of Hegel's early "Skepticism" essay. Franks makes it clear that Hegel in this essay was intensely aware of the dangers of philosophical "dogmatism." By briefly suggesting how Hegel's later conception of "phenomenology" was meant to speak to the same issues, Franks suggests that the Hegel who wrote the Phenomenology of Spirit didn't intend to regress to any form of dogmatism, either. In this, Franks agrees with recent books by Kenneth Westphal, Michael Forster, and William Bristow.

Robert Stern's "Hegel's Idealism" addresses the issue of what Hegel means by his "idealism," and whether what he means is compatible with what we should have learned from Kant. Stern criticizes the common idea that Hegel is a "mentalistic" idealist who thinks (like Bishop Berkeley) that we know the world because it's contained in our minds (or in our one great Mind), and he also criticizes Robert Pippin's proposal that Hegel's idealism is substantially the same as Kant's. Instead, Stern suggests that Hegel's idealism is based on a critique of the idea that "finite" things are self-explanatory, and on a corresponding critique of empiricism and nominalism. Hegel agrees with "classical" philosophy -- by which Stern seems to mean the broadly Platonic tradition -- that "concepts are part of the structure of reality" (p. 172). Stern presents this move to a kind of Platonism as itself motivated by Kant's argument against empiricism, that our experience is never mere sensation, but always involves concepts.

I personally view this suggestion of Stern's as one that deserves to be explored in detail, and pronto! What is Hegel's exact relation to the tradition, prior to Kant, of critiques of empiricism and nominalism? If Platonism presented a critique of empiricism and nominalism which anticipated Kant's critiques of them, then we have been mistaken in thinking that the entire tradition of "metaphysics" is superseded by Kant's criticism. What if it turned out that Hegel revises Kant's alternative to empiricism in much the same way that Aristotle and Plotinus revised the initial ("dualistic") alternative to empiricism that Plato had presented in his Meno and Phaedo?

Exploration of Hegel's relation to the Platonic tradition has probably been hindered by the fact that Plato is widely perceived as a "dualist," which Hegel obviously is not. But important broadly Platonic thinkers like Aristotle and Plotinus weren't dualists. These philosophers agreed with Plato and Robert Stern that "concepts are part of the structure of reality," and saw that this fact introduces an inescapable "hierarchy" into reality: some portions of reality are going to realize these concepts more fully than others do. To avoid letting this observation drive them into an antagonistic dualism like that of the early pages of Plato's Phaedo (in which souls are "chained" to bodies and seek, with varying success, to escape them), Aristotle tried to integrate the extremes of the hierarchy with each other through his doctrine of the "four causes," and Plotinus tried to do the same thing through his doctrine of "return" and "emanation." The modern successor of these efforts is Hegel's project of overcoming dualism through "true infinity," in which the infinite "is only as a transcending of the finite" (cf. "emanation") and the finite "is only as a transcending of itself" (cf. "return").[2] This is the original unification that lies behind Hegel's subsequent unifications of universal and particular (in the Science of Logic's Doctrine of the Concept), of Spirit and Nature in the Encyclopedia, and of reason and desire in the Introduction to the Philosophy of Right. I have given a detailed analysis of this Hegelian theme of the unification of hierarchy in my own Hegel book.[3] Understanding this theme, we should be in a position to illuminate Hegel's "idealism" by clarifying his relation to the central, broadly Platonic tradition in western philosophy.

For this topic, the Science of Logic is Hegel's most important single text. In the Companion, Stephen Houlgate's "Hegel's Logic" provides a clear and persuasive introduction to the Science of Logic. Houlgate provides lucid accounts of the Logic's general method, and of its famous first triad (Being-Nothing-Becoming). He doesn't discuss true infinity, as such, or the relation between Hegel's metaphysics and the "classical" tradition. And readers will ultimately want a fuller explanation of how Hegel's distinctive method relates to other methods with which they're more familiar. But this paper and Houlgate's recent book on the Logic will be important aids in the long-overdue detailed interpretation and appropriation of Hegel's second great book.

Kenneth Westphal's "Philosophizing About Nature: Hegel's Philosophical Project" aims to dispel the bad reputation that Hegel's philosophy of nature has had. Westphal sums up much of the extensive recent scholarship on Hegel's philosophy of nature, showing that Hegel had a sophisticated knowledge of the best natural science of his time, and that rather than dictating to natural science in an a priori fashion, Hegel intended to work with it, in the manner of what Sir Isaac Newton and others called "natural philosophy." Westphal presents Hegel's philosophical system as a kind of "emergentism," in which Hegel aims to show how nature makes human "spirit" possible (p. 306). Westphal contrasts this emergentism with conventional theism and with Stephen Houlgate's (as Westphal calls it) "purely a priori interpretation of Hegel's Logic and Encyclopedia." Houlgate's interpretation requires a type of "deduction" that Westphal says he can't understand (p. 307), and it gives Hegel's Logic a "top-down" authority that smacks, to Westphal, of "schematizing formalism" (p. 307 n. 75).

I would be inclined to say that the Logic's authority stems from the fact that, as Hegel says, Nature is the result of the Absolute Idea (the final stage of the Logic) "freely releasing itself" as the externality of space and time and so forth.[4] The Logic has authority over Nature because Nature itself embodies what the Logic has arrived at. But of course at least two questions present themselves. First, what does this Hegelian "Nature" have to do with the nature that we experience and that science studies? And second, is the process that Hegel describes here what's traditionally known as "creation," and if so, what is it that Hegel really wants to say about "God"?

Regarding the first question, suffice it to say that Hegel thinks he has grounded the Logic deeply both in human experience, including the practice of science, and in a compelling account of "reality." To see how he does this, readers can consult my book as well as Stephen Houlgate's paper and book. Regarding the second question, the Companion contains a very informative account, by Peter C. Hodgson, of "Hegel's Philosophy of Religion." Unfortunately, this deals mostly with Hegel's lectures on the philosophy of religion, and only in very general terms with the Logic. Hegel says in the lectures (LPR 1:309/VPR 1:213) that the Logic contains his "precise treatment" of the relation between finite and infinite (and thus of the relation between the world and God). Perhaps this is why commentaries on the lectures, by themselves, have not yet succeeded in bringing clarity to the long vexed scholarly discussion of just what it is that Hegel intends to say about God's reality and our knowledge thereof. Hegel's account of "true infinity," which I quoted above, makes it clear that he does not intend to do away with transcendence as such. This isn't altered by the fact that, like Aristotle and Plotinus, Hegel intends to go beyond dualistic, "spurious-infinity" conceptions of transcendence.[5] Like all Platonists, Hegel ties his conception of transcendence to the human experience of "ascending" beyond initial sensations and desires -- an ascent that he tags as the "Ought," in the Logic's argument to infinity. The remainder of Hegel's system then fills in other features of divinity, including (as I suggested) a version of "creation."

The Companion's other paper on Hegel's theology is Glenn Alexander Magee's "Hegel and Mysticism." Magee documents ways in which Hegel was influenced by "mystical" writers, including Jakob Boehme, the visionary cobbler of Goerlitz whose Aurora, published in 1612, excited many unconventional thinkers in the subsequent centuries. Magee goes on to establish, correctly, that Hegel explicitly identifies "the mystical" with "speculation," which is Hegel's term for his own type of philosophy. Magee's challenging conclusion from this evidence is that (in Hegel, at least) "the very idea of the autonomy and progressive unfolding of reason has deeply irrational roots" (p. 280).

Magee's conclusion will be plausible to readers who assume that "mysticism" in general is irrational. But Magee has given no argument for this assumption. His list of mystical traditions (pp. 270-271) for some reason does not include Neoplatonism. (Nor does he mention the sophisticated philosophical work of the Vedantists.) It's well known that Hegel was deeply interested in Plato, Aristotle, Plotinus and Proclus, each of whom can be and has been interpreted as, in important respects, a "mystic." But these writers are also, of course, known for their commitment to "reason," so considering them would cast doubt on Magee's assumption that mysticism as such is irrational.[6] We can hope that future work on the important subject of Hegel's mysticism will take proper account of the breadth of the broadly Platonic philosophical/mystical tradition to which Hegel belongs.[7]

The final paper that I'd like to touch on is Frederick Neuhouser's "Hegel's Social Philosophy." Neuhouser lays out the main lines of analysis in the Philosophy of Right, from "Abstract Right" through "Morality" to "Ethical Life," with the last having three components, the family, civil society and the state. He clarifies most of the major issues that readers have had about the relation between these parts, and the possibility of social criticism within them, and he briefly describes the relevance of Hegel's "Concept" (from the Science of Logic) to the structure of Ethical Life. One major issue in social philosophy which Hegel himself repeatedly alludes to in his system and in the Philosophy of Right, but which Neuhouser's treatment unfortunately does not illuminate, is the challenge of "atomism" or (as we might call it) "rational egoism." This issue is such an important one for Plato, for Thomas Hobbes, and for present-day economists and "rational choice" theorists that many readers will naturally wonder what Hegel has to say about it. The fact is, though, that Hegel's systematic treatment of this issue takes place primarily in the Science of Logic, in which "atomism" and the associated "evil" make their entrance just prior to Quantity, and they are finally overcome in the Idea, at the very end of the Logic.[8] (With a reprise at the end of "Morality," as well.) So the Science of Logic is just as indispensable to a full understanding of what Hegel accomplished in social philosophy as it is in the other areas that I've discussed.

[1] I might mention that my own book, Hegel's Philosophy of Reality, Freedom, and God (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005), doesn't shrink from "metaphysics" in the way that Beiser and the authors he refers to do. My book is also the first to offer a detailed response to Charles Taylor's rather devastating critique of Hegel's metaphysics, a critique that may have been one source of the anxiety that more recent authors seem to feel.

[2] G.W.F. Hegel, Hegel's Science of Logic, trans. Miller (New York: Humanities, 1969), p. 145 (GW 21:133).

[3] Robert M. Wallace (2005). See especially chapter 3.

[4] Hegel's Science of Logic, p. 843 (GW 12:253); my emphasis.

[5] See Wallace (2005), chapter 3, especially pp. 96-102.

[6] See Wallace (2005), pp. 104-106. I respond in more detail on pp. 106-109 to Magee's critique of Hegel in his Hegel and the Hermetic Tradition (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 2001).

[7] We can consult especially Werner Beierwaltes, Platonismus und Idealismus (Frankfurt am Main: Klostermann, 2004).

[8] See Wallace (2005), chapters 3 and 5.