The Cambridge Companion to Heidegger’s Being and Time

Placeholder book cover

Mark A. Wrathall (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Heidegger’s Being and Time, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 426pp., $34.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521720564.

Reviewed by Leslie MacAvoy, East Tennessee State University


The Cambridge Companion series occupies a venerable position in the growing field of ‘companion books’. As one of the earliest, if not the earliest, series in this genre, the Cambridge Companions have never been primarily about serving as reader’s guides for undergraduates, but have instead been directed at an audience of advanced students and scholars. This volume lives up to that standard. The essays presume a familiarity with Heidegger’s text and therefore may not be very accessible to those reading Being and Time for the first time, but they will certainly be suitable for graduate students and possibly advanced undergraduates. The high level of the discussion throughout the anthology will also make it of considerable interest to scholars as well.

This particular volume is unusual for the Cambridge Companion series in that it focuses on a specific text. That Heidegger’s Being and Time numbers among the handful of books selected for this distinctive treatment is certainly noteworthy and indicates a growing recognition by those outside of the field of the importance of Heidegger’s work and of the contribution of this book to twentieth century philosophy.

The volume contains seventeen chapters. The first is a lengthy chapter-by-chapter summary of Being and Time, authored by Wrathall and Max Murphey, and is presumably intended to give those less familiar with Heidegger’s text some sense of the order of its chapters and the topics that they address. Although there is no explicit structure to group the essays, the first three seem to address preliminary and overarching themes and issues, the next twelve focus on topics raised within Being and Time and are ordered more or less as they appear in the text, and the final essay again adopts a more global perspective.

The book is lengthy, and while one cannot expect an anthology to cover every topic exhaustively, it does seem that temporality does not receive as much attention here as it should. Though there is one essay on temporality, the topic is substantial enough and prominent enough in Heidegger’s text to have warranted at least two essays. One might also have wanted a bit more on historicity and on Heidegger’s phenomenological method. But these gaps in coverage don’t detract from the value of what does appear, and overall, this is a very good volume of essays, and worth careful reading by anyone interested in Heidegger. In what follows I will provide a brief sketch of each essay following the overview and conclude with some remarks about the overall volume.

Alfred Denker’s essay, "Martin Heidegger’s Being and Time: A Carefully Planned Accident?" (Ch. 2), explores the ‘origin’ of Being and Time, claiming that in some sense it appeared ‘accidentally’ when Heidegger was finishing the manuscript of a long-planned book on Aristotle. Accounts of Heidegger’s journey to Being and Time have been offered before, but Denker is able to tell the story in fresh terms and in a way that is not primarily biographical or historical, but more philosophical.[1] He traces out the various paths of thinking that Heidegger pursued in these years, and resists the impulse to impose a philosophical narrative coherence on these sometimes diverging paths, honoring the facticity of Heidegger’s own thinking.

"The Question of Being" (Ch. 3), Taylor Carman, intends to explain what is meant by Heidegger’s famous question of being (Seinsfrage). Of particular importance here is what Heidegger means by ‘being’ and what he does not mean by it. Carman raises and defends Heidegger’s position against a number of possible objections. Perhaps one of the more important contributions of the essay is its clarification of the distinction Heidegger draws between the ontic and the ontological and what relationship it bears to another distinction with which it is often associated, namely the empirical and the transcendental.[2] Carman argues that while there are some similarities between these two distinctions, they are not equivalent.

Wayne Martin’s "The Semantics of ‘Dasein’ and the Modality of Being and Time" (Ch. 4) notes that Heidegger frequently makes modal claims to the effect that some trait of Dasein is necessary or that something is only possible on the basis of some deeper ontological feature. Martin wants to determine what warrants these modal claims and decides that much depends on how one understands the semantics of the term ‘Dasein’. He offers an account of an ‘exemplar semantics’ of Dasein as an alternative to extensionalist and intensionalist semantic accounts that he thinks are inadequate. While one might have thought the question of how these modal claims are justified is to be answered by an analysis of Heidegger’s phenomenological method, Martin’s point is presumably that one has first to be clear about what the object of that phenomenology is.

Of the next twelve essays, Chapters 5-11 deal with topics pertaining to Division I, while Chapters 12-16 deal with topics pertaining to Division II. Division I contains the analyses of Dasein as Being-in-the-world. It is probably the most well-known portion of Being and Time and has received the most attention in the secondary literature in the last twenty years, particularly through what has come to be known as the pragmatist interpretation.[3] It is perhaps because of this fact that the essays in this group seem to focus on issues that feature less prominently in the pragmatist interpretation.

In his contribution, "Heidegger on Space and Spatiality" (Ch. 5), David R. Cerbone endeavors to make sense of Heidegger’s brief remarks on spatiality. He argues that Heidegger’s attempts to derive notions of spatial proximity and distance from Dasein’s circumspective concern end up having an unexpected mentalistic dimension to them that undermines the sense in which they can be understood as truly spatial. He concludes that this problem is due to insufficient attention to embodiment.

Hubert L. Dreyfus’ "Being-with-Others" (Ch. 6) opens with the observation that while Heidegger seems to overcome the Cartesian subject in his account of Dasein’s engagement with equipment in ‘absorbed coping,’ his account of Being-with-Others could be read as reinscribing some version of the Cartesian subject, and in this regard the critique of Cartesianism might be seen as only partially successful. Against this, Dreyfus argues that Heidegger’s account of what Dasein is like when it is absorbed in the one (das Man) challenges this view, and he suggests that neuroscientific work on mirror neurons might provide an explanation for how we prereflectively acquire the norms in terms of which we are acculturated into shared practices.

Mood (Befindlichkeit) in Being and Time is the mode of disclosedness that seems to receive the least attention in the literature, and in "Why Mood Matters" (Ch. 7), Matthew Ratcliffe attempts to correct this. He focuses on defending the claim that moods constitute how we find ourselves in the world and on clarifying a number of issues surrounding Heidegger’s treatment of moods. Ratcliffe argues that moods are not intentional states or emotions, but ways of finding ourselves that make possible certain kinds of intentional states. In this regard moods are "pre-subjective and pre-objective" (157). Furthermore, moods vary in depth, and some might be conditions for others.

Wrathall’s essay, "Heidegger on Human Understanding" (Ch. 8), focuses on a topic that has received much more attention in the literature, but in this essay he resists the dominant pragmatist view of understanding as a kind of know-how. That view, he maintains, presents a vertical account in which acts of interpretation are based upon more basic acts of understanding. He argues, however, that understanding is not an act; it is a comportment, which is a concretization of understanding as a structure for the projection of possibilities (178). The function of this structure is to disclose the world as a setting for meaningful action.

In Ch. 9, "Heidegger’s Pragmatic-Existential Theory of Language and Assertion," Barbara Fultner identifies two seemingly conflicting conceptions of language inBeing and Time: an instrumental conception wherein language is a tool for conveying meaning, and a constitutive conception, wherein language constitutes meaning and belongs to Dasein’s existential structure. Fultner argues that these two conceptions only seem to be in tension, however, insofar as a pragmatic-existential view of language can account for both of these dimensions of language.

In the next essay, "The Empire of Signs: Heidegger’s Critique of Idealism in Being and Time" (Ch. 10), Peter E. Gordon argues that Heidegger’s critique of idealism is not necessarily a rejection of all forms of idealism, but is targeted quite specifically at the logical idealism of the Marburg school of Neo-Kantianism, which holds that the intelligibility of things lies in thought alone. Heidegger challenges intellectualist constructivist implications of this view by arguing that the intelligibility of things is instead rooted in Dasein’s involvement in the world, but this position, rather than being anti-idealist, seems to amount to an “idealism of human practices” (235).

In the last essay dealing with Division I, "Heidegger on Skepticism, Truth, and Falsehood" (Ch. 11), Denis McManus uses resources from Heidegger’s discussion of falsehood in the 1925-26 Logic lectures to argue that familiarity with the world is a condition for holding both true and false beliefs. The notion that even a false belief presupposes this familiarity is presumably a rejoinder to the skeptic. McManus makes this case by showing that thought is embedded in practices and skills. For instance, if one holds the false belief that some object is two meters long, one must have a prior familiarity not only with the object, but with practices of measurement, how one measures correctly or incorrectly, and so on.

The next five essays deal with topics drawn from Division II. In "Death and Demise in Being and Time" (Ch. 12), Iain Thomson discusses two different interpretations of the concept of death in that text. Heidegger distinguishes between demise (Ableben), which is the ending of one’s life, and dying (Sterben), which is a possibility into which one is thrown insofar as one lives or exists at all. On Thomson’s account, one interpretation holds that dying has to be understood in connection with demise in some sense if it is to be intelligible, while another interpretation holds that the two phenomena are radically distinct -- that demise represents total and permanent "world collapse," while dying represents a temporary world collapse that one could "live through" (263). Though Thomson is more sympathetic to the second view, he thinks it overstates the separation of the two phenomena, and argues that demise operates in Heidegger’s text as a formal indication of dying.

"Freedom and the ‘Choice to Choose Oneself’ in Being and Time" (Ch. 13) by Béatrice Han-Pile explores what Heidegger means by freedom in Being and Time. Han-Pile distinguishes first between an ontological freedom connected with Dasein’s being, and an ontic freedom that is achieved only if one has made the "choice to choose oneself," which she argues involves ascribing responsibility to oneself. Although the language of choice used here might suggest a connection with a voluntaristic rationalism that Heidegger’s philosophy otherwise resists, she argues that while choosing to choose oneself might require a certain amount of transparency about one’s ontological freedom, it doesn’t require reflective deliberation (308), but is instead undertaken in a medio-passive mode.

In Ch. 14, "Authenticity and Resoluteness," William Blattner elaborates on three main approaches to thinking about authenticity (the existentialist, Aristotelian, and transcendental approaches) and weaves them together to generate a cohesive view of authenticity as a kind of self-ownership that proceeds from an awareness of oneself in Being-towards-death that is then attested in conscience. In this way he argues that these interpretations do not contradict one another, but rather emphasize different aspects of Heidegger’s view.

In the only essay in the volume dedicated to the topic of temporality, "Temporality as the Ontological Sense of Care" (Ch. 15), Stephan Käufer focuses on the easily overlooked ¶65, where Heidegger makes the important claim that temporality provides the ontological ground for the care structure and hence for Dasein’s being. Making sense of this section is crucial for demonstrating the relevance of the discussion of temporality in Division II for the analysis of Dasein in Division I. Käufer provides an illuminating account of originary temporality with extensive reference to Kant and Heidegger’s reading of Kant, and argues that this temporality makes up the existential concept of selfhood (355-56). The topic of temporality has received relatively little attention in the recent literature on Being and Time, and this essay importantly addresses this lacuna.[4]

"Historical Finitude" (Ch. 16) sets out to deal with the topic of historicality and historicity in Being and Time. In approaching this topic, Joseph K. Schear organizes his essay around the goal of illuminating one particular claim that Heidegger makes in ¶74: "Authentic Being-towards-death - that is to say, the finitude of temporality - is the hidden basis of Dasein’s historicality" (SZ 386). This strategy leads him to offer a brief overall interpretation of the text, culminating in a characterization of the existential situation of the ‘moment of vision’ (Augenblick) as a moment where a whole historical form of life is at stake.

In the final essay, "What if Heidegger Were a Phenomenologist?" (Ch. 17), Thomas Sheehan returns us to a consideration of broader programmatic issues. His core thesis is that if Heidegger were a phenomenologist, his topic would be meaning, not being. Sheehan’s overarching concern here is one that he has expressed in other places, but the formulation of the argument here is novel,[5] and he offers suggestions for how we might go about rethinking Heidegger’s project in these terms. He identifies multiple places in Heidegger’s text where one could substitute Sinn (sense/meaning) for Sein (being) without any loss of meaning (no pun intended).

Sheehan has a point, though it might also be difficult to simply drop any use of the term ‘being’, as it was the term Heidegger chose and not just occasionally, but more or less continuously. We would also be faced with the problem of making sense of his famous claim that "only as phenomenology is ontology possible."[6] One is struck, then, by how divergent this last essay and the first essay on the question of being appear to be. Also puzzling is the implication that doing ontology and doing phenomenology are separate enterprises in a way that they seem not to have been for Heidegger. But Sheehan is responding to a certain tendency to reify being that occurs in the secondary literature, so perhaps one can say that to do ontology rightly is to do phenomenology and that if we have read Heidegger carefully and paid attention to what he was trying to do philosophically, we will not be confused or misled by the term ‘being’.

Regardless of what one concludes about this, one is struck in reading this volume by how much regarding Being and Time is still debated and contested. While all Heidegger scholars are familiar with this text, many do not work on it, perhaps because of a sense that it has been discussed for so long that its interpretation is settled. This volume should disabuse anyone of that view. The divergence between the first and last essays is particularly stark, but the careful reader will find subtle points of disagreement throughout in addition to the clearly articulated interpretive differences that are explicitly thematized. Thus, there is clearly much more to be said, and one hopes that an awareness of this will invite more scholars to join the discussion.

[1] The most well known of these is Theodore Kisiel, The Genesis of Heidegger’s Being and Time (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1993), but also noteworthy is John van Buren, The Young Heidegger: Rumor of the Hidden King (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1994).

[2] One of the more well-known examples of this way of reading the ontic/ontological distinction can be found in Cristina Lafont, Heidegger, Language, and World-Disclosure, trans. G. Harman (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000).

[3] For a well-known example of this interpretation, see Hubert L. Dreyfus, Being-in-the-world: A Commentary on Heidegger’s Being and Time, Division I (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1991). The propensity of recent scholarship on Being and Time to focus on Division I to the exclusion of Division II or, if Division II is considered, to focus only on the discussions of death and authenticity seems to have its source in this reading.

[4] A notable exception is William D. Blattner, Heidegger’s Temporal Idealism (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999).

[5] See for example, Thomas Sheehan, “Astonishing! Things Make Sense!,” Gatherings: The Heidegger Circle Annual 1 (2011): 1-25.

[6] Martin Heidegger, Sein und Zeit, 9th ed. (Tübingen: Max Niemeyer, 1960).