The Cambridge Companion to Hobbes's Leviathan

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Patricia Springborg (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Hobbes's Leviathan, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 533pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521545211.

Reviewed by Susanne Sreedhar, Boston University


The 350th anniversary of the publication of Thomas Hobbes's Leviathan has occasioned a number of critical anthologies. In the space of three years, four such collections have appeared; The Cambridge Companion to Hobbes's Leviathan is the latest. Given this recent flurry of publications, one might wonder what niche another volume could fill. In answer to such a question, Patricia Springborg, the editor, identifies three deficiencies in the existing literature on Leviathan: a general lack of attention to the context in which Hobbes wrote, a pronounced tendency to ignore the second half of Leviathan. and an unfortunate separation between the Anglophone and Continental traditions of Hobbes scholarship. With this Cambridge Companion, Springborg hopes to redress these deficiencies by collecting essays that address Hobbes's theology and ecclesiology, provide a historical context for Hobbes's views, and focus on the significance of Leviathan for continental political thought. The volume is divided into five sections: four that parallel the four parts of Leviathan ('Of Man', 'Of Commonwealth', 'Of a Christian Commonwealth', and 'Of the Kingdom of Darkness'), and a fifth focusing on its reception.

The Cambridge Companion to Hobbes's Leviathan is wide-ranging in many respects. It contains twenty-one essays (plus an editor's introduction), by authors from ten different countries and numerous academic disciplines. Given the breadth of these essays, I cannot comment on each one. So, I will attempt to give a flavor of the work as a whole while highlighting some of the more interesting and important pieces.

Part I, 'Of Man', begins with two essays on the iconography of Leviathan; Horst Bredekamp focuses on the frontispiece and Johan Tralau on the image of the mythical monster itself. Both claim that understanding Hobbes's use of imagery is absolutely essential to understanding his philosophical and political project. However, while both pieces present interesting accounts of the relevance of the iconography to the interpretation of Leviathan, this claim seems too strong. After all, many readers have neglected the visual imagery of Leviathan without thereby fundamentally misunderstanding the book. Next, Cees Leijenhorst offers a detailed analysis of the anti-Aristotelian aspects of Hobbes's theory of sense perception. Essays by Kinch Hoekstra and Tom Sorell round out the first part of the volume. Their contributions stand out in comparison to the rest of the volume as the most likely to be accessible to non-specialists. Both are clear and engaging without sacrificing philosophical sophistication or appropriate historical contextualization. Moreover, Hoekstra and Sorell are the only contributors to address the analytic tradition of Hobbes scholarship, of which there is a great deal. Hoekstra's topic is Hobbes's account of the natural condition of mankind and his argument that this so-called "state of nature" is a state of war. He nicely spells out the limitations of the state of nature model given by rational choice theorists. Sorell gives an overview of the key tenets of Hobbes's moral philosophy including the laws of nature, addressing David Gauthier's and Jean Hampton's readings of Hobbes. Both Hoekstra and Sorell are critical of the decision theoretic school of Hobbes interpretation, but their criticisms are thoughtful and fair.

Part II, 'Of Commonwealth', begins with Quentin Skinner's analysis of Hobbes's theory of representation. His paper is well argued, reiterating points that he has made elsewhere; thus, this essay will come as no surprise to those familiar with Skinner's work. The essay by Gabriella Slomp on glory addresses some of the ideas more fully developed in her book, Thomas Hobbes and the Political Philosophy of Glory (London: Macmillan/New York: St. Martin's Press, 2000). Lucien Jaume considers the question of Hobbes's relation to the liberal tradition, cataloging the various liberal and anti-liberal themes in his political philosophy. Jaume argues provocatively but convincingly that Hobbes should be read as a "proto-liberal" because he gives primacy of place to the right to resist the sovereign power and the capacity to judge that necessarily attends it (210). Part II concludes with Dieter Hüning's critical reading of Hobbes's doctrine of punishment. This essay offers a thought-provoking, though too brief, discussion of the influence of this doctrine on Pufendorf.

Parts III and IV, 'Of a Christian Commonwealth' and 'Of the Kingdom of Darkness', contain the essays most directly related to Hobbes's views on theology and ecclesiology. Frank Lessay argues that Hobbes subscribed to a genuine covenant theology, although it is a covenant theology that is unorthodox and subversive. Moreover, Lessay makes an interesting case for the claim that Hobbes's covenant theology has a fundamentally political dimension, paralleling the structure of his social contract doctrine. Luc Foisneau also draws on the analogy between the political sovereign and God in Hobbes's thought. Foisneau demonstrates the ways in which the seventeenth century notion of irresistible power "provides a reference point in situating Hobbes's theory on the kingdom of God by nature in the long history of the theology on omnipotence" (273). Edwin Curley weighs in on the continuing debate about Hobbes's position on the sovereign's right to control religious expression. He offers a useful comparison between Hobbes's and Spinoza's positions on religious toleration, suggesting that they might be more similar than they at first seem. Johann Sommerville, with characteristic clarity and depth, examines the complicated relationship between Hobbes and the Anglicans of his time. The nicest part of this essay is Sommerville's illustration of Hobbes's strategy of redeploying the arguments that Anglicans raised against their opponents against the Anglicans themselves. A.P. Martinich offers a new twist on the theme of Hobbes's relationship with Protestantism, showing in great detail how elements of the various forms of Protestantism in Hobbes's time were or were not incorporated into Leviathan. His discussion here is consonant with his long-standing, but very controversial, argument that we should understand Hobbes's representations of himself as a "good English Protestant" to be "serious and honest" (375).

The fifth and final section of the volume is devoted to the reception of Hobbes's work and to the reception of Leviathan in particular. G.A.J. Rogers carefully charts the influences on and responses to Hobbes's various philosophical texts by his contemporaries both in England and on the Continent. His essay offers valuable and rare insight into the character of some of Hobbes's most important interpersonal relationships. Jon Parkin gives a chronological account of how Leviathan became part of mainstream political and religious discussion and how it became officially condemned and publicly notorious. Perez Zagorin takes up the relationship between Hobbes and the particular criticisms leveled by Edward Hyde, earl of Clarendon, who wrote one of the most important, well known, and penetrating critiques of Hobbes's work. In the final essay of the volume, Jeffrey R. Collins describes the earliest attempts to censor Leviathan. This article is taken from Collins' new book on Hobbes, entitled The Allegiance of Thomas Hobbes (Oxford, 2005). With its nearly exclusive emphasis on historical issues and an extensive degree of historical detail, this final section will be of most interest to the intellectual historian and perhaps less so to the philosopher.

There is no question that The Cambridge Companion to Hobbes's Leviathan achieves its main goals. It showcases recent work that takes the second half of the book as well as its historical context seriously, and it addresses Leviathan's influence on the political and philosophical traditions on the Continent. The reader cannot help but come away with a richer understanding of Hobbes's most famous work.

It is important to note, however, that this Cambridge Companion is not for the uninitiated. It presupposes both a deep familiarity with the corpus of Hobbes's work and a fairly extensive knowledge of the historical context and the scholarly debates about that context. Thus, most essays will be of little benefit for the student or non-specialist (the exceptions are noted above). Furthermore, the emphasis of the volume is undoubtedly intellectual history of a certain sort. Thus, the philosophically minded (and especially the analytically philosophically minded) might be slightly disappointed by the lack of attention given to the philosophical import of many of the historical or interpretive discussions. However, although such discussions might not be of immediate interest to those interested in the philosophical side, they most certainly provide insights that will be of interest and use to the Hobbes scholar of any discipline.