The Cambridge Companion to Kant and Modern Philosophy

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Paul Guyer (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Kant and Modern Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 736pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521823036.
Purdue University

Reviewed by Jacqueline Mariña, Purdue University


This volume contains an impressive collection of essays on some of the most important aspects of Kant's philosophy. Contributors include both senior Kant scholars, as well as some of the ablest younger scholars in the field. The book is meant to "supplement, rather than supplant" the earlier Companion to Kant, published in 1992. The essays cover a wider range of material in Kant's philosophy than the earlier volume, offering a more extensive treatment of Kant's moral and political philosophy, as well as a more in-depth treatment of issues in Kant's theoretical philosophy. A specific aim of the collection is to situate Kant's thought in relation to that of his predecessors, as well as to briefly indicate the reception and effective history of his thought. This is done in relation to each of the topics covered. The historical contextualization of the problems Kant addressed does much to illuminate the critical philosophy in its own terms and to avoid anachronistic readings of Kant's project. The brief discussions of the reception of Kant's ideas at the end of each essay help the reader to understand ways in which Kant's thought impacted the history of philosophy. Substantive questions such as the tenability of Kant's doctrines given developments in science, logic, and mathematics are also often addressed, as are comparisons of Kant's ideas with important philosophers of the twentieth century such as Quine.

The first nine chapters of the book are devoted to Kant's theoretical philosophy. In the first chapter, "A Priori," Philip Kitcher discusses Kant's understanding of the a priori, seeking to delineate "a conception of a priori knowledge that both emerges from Kant's official definition and relates to the issues of 'truths of reason' that occupied Kant's predecessors" (37). He critiques Kant's claim that the "marks" of the a priori are necessity and universality, and then compares Kant's understanding of the function of the a priori with Chomsky's "generative grammar." In the second chapter, "Kant on the perception of space and time," Gary Hatfield assesses the background to Kant's understanding of space and time by exploring the views of Descartes, Leibniz, Wolff, and Crusius; follows the development of Kant's own views (including an exposition of Kant's arguments in the transcendental aesthetic); and surveys the reception of Kant's views during the nineteenth and twentieth centuries.

Two of the most informative and illuminating essays in this section follow, namely Lisa Shabel's "Kant's philosophy of mathematics" and Beatrice Longuenesse's "Kant on a priori concepts." Both essays follow Kant's arguments closely and do an excellent job of demonstrating both the plausibility of Kant's views on the subject and how they relate to the rest of the critical philosophy. In her chapter on mathematics, Shabel first compares Kant's philosophy of mathematics with that of his rationalist predecessors, who believed that the truth of mathematical propositions could be explained through conceptual analysis alone. For Kant, on the other hand, mathematical propositions are not analytic but are synthetic. Shabel links Kant's understanding of mathematical and geometrical judgments as synthetic with his claim that mathematical concepts must be constructed in pure intuition: for Kant "the key to mathematical demonstration is the mathematician's ability to produce figures via construction according to a priori concepts" (99). It is only through the actual act of constructing the figure in pure intuition that properties of the figure -- not contained in its concept alone -- are able to emerge; this is the sense in which the judgments of geometry are synthetic. Shabel proceeds to discuss how Kant envisions mathematical judgments to be a priori, having the marks of necessity and universality even though the figures constructed in pure intuition are singular. Given her exposition of Kant's analysis of mathematical judgments as synthetic a priori, she then discusses how Kant's philosophy of mathematics informs his transcendental idealism.

The following chapter by Beatrice Longuenesse deals with Kant's too often neglected metaphysical deduction. This is a superb piece of work. In it Longuenesse briefly details the historical development of Kant's views on the relation between logic and ontology, from his early assumption that logical principles are also ontological to his later denial of this identity in his distinction between logical and real relations. It is this distinction that sets up the problem for the critical philosophy, namely, the question of how logic is capable of capturing fundamental features of the world. Longuenesse analyzes Kant's all-important distinction between general and transcendental logic, and how it redefines how we are to understand "the grip our intellect can have on the structural features of the world" (135). She argues that this new way of conceiving the relation between logic and ontology grounds Kant's metaphysical deduction of the categories. Important in this regard is the fact that Kant's distinction between the two kinds of access that we have to reality -- spontaneity and receptivity ­-- lies at the bottom of Kant's separation of logic and ontology. Kant's initial distinctions thus set up the problem that he is to solve in both the metaphysical and transcendental deductions and the proofs of the principles of the pure understanding. This fundamental problem has to do with how the functions of judgment can be applicable to what is given through intuition. Longuenesse then gives an extended analysis of Kant's understanding of concepts as resting on functions ("the unity of the action of ordering different representations under a common one" A 68/B93), and how this view of concepts structures his understanding of judgment. The rest of the chapter strives to illuminate Kant's contention that "the same function that gives unity to different representations in a judgment also gives unity to the mere synthesis of different representations in an intuition… ." (A 79/B104-5). Very briefly, Longuenesse argues that Kant's table of logical forms

can only have emerged from Kant's painstaking reflections about the relation between the forms according to which we relate concepts to other concepts, and thus to objects … and forms according to which we may combine manifolds in intuition so that they may fall under concepts… . (146)

Longuenesse's discussion is compact, illuminating and to the point, a must-read for anyone who hopes to understand the metaphysical deduction.

In chapter five, "Kant's philosophy of the cognitive mind," Patricia Kitcher develops Kant's theory of the mind. She first provides a brief history of how the mind was conceived in the philosophy of Descartes, Locke, Leibniz and Hume, discusses Hume's influence on Kant's theory of the mind, explores Kant's early understanding of the mind, and then reconstructs Kant's understanding of the mind through an analysis of his arguments in the transcendental deduction. Here she makes some very interesting suggestions concerning the question of personal identity in Kant. Arthur Melnick reconstructs Kant's analogies of experience in the sixth chapter, "Kant's proofs of substance and causation," and then proceeds to show how Kant's arguments can be used against Quine's doctrine of "ontological relativity." In chapter seven, "Kant and transcendental arguments," Ralph C. S. Walker discusses how Kant's arguments led to the development of "transcendental arguments," whose purpose is to answer the skeptical challenge. He provides an analysis of the nature of such arguments, and then concludes that Kant's own method of transcendental argumentation undermines his idealism.

The significance of Kant's transcendental dialectic is explored by Karl Ameriks in the eighth chapter, "The critique of metaphysics." In it Ameriks discusses Kant's critique of the older metaphysical systems that purported to give rationalist proofs for the existence and character of the soul, the world, and God, exploring both the structure of the dialectic and the question of just how much metaphysics it annihilated. Two issues are addressed in this regard, idealism and the unconditioned. Ameriks stresses that Kant's idealism is merely of the "formal" variety, and provides a useful discussion of how Kant conceived of the relation between appearances and things in themselves. The fourth section of the chapter contains an illuminating analysis of Kant's understanding of the unconditioned and how it relates to the ideas of the older metaphysics. Ameriks argues that at the core of Kant's critique of the older metaphysics is his claim that "with all possible perceptions, you always remain caught up in conditions, whether in space or time, and you never get to the unconditioned" (A 483/ B511). The error of dogmatism is then that it tries to "determine the in itself by making spatio-temporal features ('forms of sensibility') into something unconditioned" (289). The charge is directly relevant to the philosophies of Kant's predecessors, namely, those of Leibniz, Berkeley and Hume. In the last part of the chapter, Ameriks summarizes five major reactions to Kant's notion of the unconditioned.

The last chapter in this section is Michael Friedman's "Philosophy of natural science." Friedman details Kant's engagement with the natural sciences during both the pre-critical and critical periods, with an eye to determining the centrality of Kant's commitment to Newtonian physical theory and Euclidian geometry to his critical enterprise as a whole. A major concern of the chapter is with Kant's Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science. Friedman contends that Kant is committed to both the synthetic a priori status of Euclidean geometry and Newtonian physics, but the fact that both have been supplanted in contemporary science does not vitiate the lasting significance of the critical philosophy.

Missing from this section on Kant's theoretical philosophy is a discussion of the structure of the transcendental deduction itself, as well as a discussion of Kant's refutation of idealism, two very important issues for a proper understanding of the first Critique. To be sure, the earlier Companion to Kant included a discussion of the transcendental deduction, but an updated article on the deduction showing how it works with the metaphysical deduction, as well as with the analogies of experience would have been helpful. On the whole, however, the section contains important material for a proper understanding of Kant's theoretical philosophy and the watershed role it played in modern philosophy.

The second section of the book explores Kant's practical and political philosophy, as well as his philosophy of religion. It begins with an essay by Allen Wood, "The Supreme Principle of Morality." In keeping with this chapter's title, Wood discusses the nature and function of Kant's supreme principle of morality and his formulation of it as a "categorical imperative." He argues convincingly that the principle's most developed and universal form is Kant's formula of the autonomy of the will (FA), and that only this formula unites Kant's two other formulations of the categorical imperative within itself. The latter part of the essay explores the claims made by Klaus Reich in his 1939 article in Mind concerning Kant's sources in Cicero and in the Stoic philosopher Panaetius of Rhodes. This is an enormously illuminating article. It is followed by another excellent piece (chapter 11) by Henry Allison, "Kant on freedom of the will." Allison notes the different conceptions of freedom to which Kant refers, focusing on the "nature of and relation between freedom as spontaneity and as autonomy." Because both ways of understanding freedom involve independence from natural causality, Allison then also treats freedom in both senses in their relation to Kant's transcendental idealism. He provides a revealing analysis of Kant's theory in relation to his predecessors, Leibniz, Wolff, and, most interesting of all, Crusius (the foremost opponent of Wolffianism in Germany and someone who greatly influenced Kant). The later part of the chapter details the influence of Kant's thought on Fichte, Hegel and Schopenhauer.

The next three essays deal with Kant's political philosophy. In his chapter "Mine and Thine," Robert Pippin examines how Kant ties the principle of right with his moral theory in his Doctrine of Right, arguing that Kant justifies the state's authority through his claim that only through such authority can property rights be established. The next chapter by Jane Kneller, "Kant on Sex and the Marriage Right," is an intelligent and sensitive exploration of Kant's position on marriage. Kneller offers a partial defense of Kant's claims regarding marriage from a feminist perspective, and contextualizes his views in terms of the historical and political realities of the time as well as their philosophical background. In chapter 14, "Kant's theory of peace," Pauline Kleingeld offers an analysis of Kant's normative theory of international relations. Does Kant believe that a non-coercive league of states is the only feasible form of international cooperation, or does he advocate a much stronger international federation of states with the authority to coercively enforce a common law? Kleingeld provides strong arguments for her claim that Kant "advocates the establishment of a noncoercive league of states;" however, he does so because "he regards it as the only possible road to the ultimate ideal, a state of states" (483). This section provides excellent discussions of Kant's political philosophy in the context of the Enlightenment, and is a welcome corrective to treatments of Kant that ignore his engagement with important political issues.

In Chapter 15, Lara Denis details Kant's understanding of virtue. She first gives a short exposition of how virtue has been understood in the history of philosophy and then situates Kant's views in relation to his predecessors. Denis lists six characteristics of Kant's understanding of virtue: (a) virtue is the disposition to act out of respect for the moral law; (b) it is moral self-constraint (c) requiring strength. This is because (d) we are finite rational agents having inclinations that do not necessarily coincide with the moral law, and as such (e) virtue is the moral disposition in conflict. Lastly, (f) Kant distinguishes between noumenal and phenomenal virtue. This chapter also includes an interesting analysis of the role emotions play in moral action; it is a useful exposition of the way that Kant understands virtue, although more could have been done in the way of analysis to answer Kant's critics.

Paul Guyer provides an in-depth analysis of Kant's Critique of the Power of Judgment in chapter 16. He suggests that it can be illuminating to read the third critique in light of a protracted argument with Hume; in this light he analyzes three principal topics in the third Critique, namely: (a) Kant's suggestion that the systematicity of the empirical laws of nature can ground their necessity; (b) the problem of how to ground the universal validity of judgments of taste, and lastly (c) the moral significance of a teleological conception of nature. The first part of the chapter is devoted to an informative discussion of Hume on causal necessity, taste, and the arguments from design, and the second part examines what Kant has to say on each of these questions. One of the most thought-provoking parts of the essay is Guyer's discussion of Kant's take on the relation between the scientific goal of understanding the products of nature in mechanistic terms and judgments concerning the final, moral end of nature, especially in regard to Kant's "antinomy of teleological judgment." Regarding this antinomy, Guyer notes,

the real resolution of the antinomy seems to be the two-leveled, transcendental idealist solution that we must conceive of the designer of nature as existing outside of the appearances of nature and as accomplishing his purposes through the uniformly mechanistic laws of nature. (572)

The idea is fascinating, and Guyer's suggestion leaves the reader hoping for more of an in-depth development. However, Guyer then goes on suggest that "it is unlikely that many will be convinced that we must conceive of nature as morally purposive unless they are already starting from a theological point of view… " (577). Guyer's criticism overlooks the fact that Kant's argument is that it is the moral law within us that compels us to hope that the world is ultimately ordered in such a way that it is hospitable to the human development of virtue. Kant's argument for why we must think of nature as morally purposive does not have a theological starting point (although it may lead to some theological conclusions). Nevertheless, Guyer's discussion on this subject nicely complements his introductory chapter drawing attention to the two core themes of Kant's philosophy, namely "the starry heavens above and the moral law within me," and highlights the importance of this largely undeveloped theme in Kant's philosophy.

This issue is once again picked up in Fred Beiser's piece, "Moral faith and the highest good." The chapter explores aspects of Kant's philosophy of religion, focusing on Kant's doctrine of moral faith through a discussion of three interrelated themes: (a) the ideal of the highest good; (b) the postulates of God and immortality, and (c) the concept of rational faith. Beiser's intention is to defend the pivotal role moral faith plays in Kant's philosophy. To this end, he provides an in-depth analysis of Kant's understanding of the highest good -- the central and driving concept behind Kant's notion of moral faith -- first situating Kant's take on the concept in relation to the development of the concept in the history of philosophy. Beiser notes Kant's rejection of the secular alternatives of the Aufklärung, namely Epicureanism and Stoicism, and Kant's reaffirmation of the traditional Christian view. He provides an interesting discussion of Kant's understanding of the highest good in light of Augustine's City of God, and affirms that the precedent for Kant's argument can be found in both Augustine and Leibniz. Beiser defends the intelligibility of Kant's metaphysical commitments on practical rational grounds, stressing that Kant's doctrine of the highest good and his arguments regarding the conditions of its possibility arise from the "deeper problems he [Kant] is attempting to address, namely, that these ideals [moral precepts] cannot have their binding force unless we make definitive constitutive assumptions about the moral structure of the world" (620). Beiser is certainly correct to stress that it is these questions regarding the character of the phenomenal nature in which we exist, and its relation to the imperatives of morality revealing our membership in an intelligible world, that drive Kant's understanding of the highest good and the moral faith attendant upon it. He is less successful in providing a close analysis of the details of Kant's arguments concerning why the morally committed individual also needs to make certain assumptions about the ultimate structure of nature as a whole. Nevertheless, this chapter provides a valuable guide to Kant's understanding of moral faith, and it correctly outlines the structure of Kant's argument: it is our commitment to the moral law that leads us to affirm that the natural world must have an ethico-teleological goal.

The volume concludes, fittingly, with Manfred Kuehn's "Kant's critical philosophy and its reception -- the first five years." In this chapter, Kuehn provides an overview of the different responses to Kant's thought by his contemporaries, and shows how these responses influenced the direction of Kant's thought. Kuehn focuses specifically on the developments from 1781 to 1786, the period during which Kant's first Critique first appeared and then became increasingly popular. This is an informative essay in the early Wirkungsgeschichte of Kant's thought. The end of the volume contains a very useful selective bibliography focusing on recent books and collections of articles; it contains an inclusive list of books in English and the most important works in French and German.

Overall, this is an excellent volume, certainly one of the best and fullest collections of essays on Kant in the English language, covering a wide range of issues in Kant scholarship. It will be helpful to students and Kant scholars alike, both presenting issues in Kant's philosophy with clarity and rigor as well as showcasing ways of understanding Kant and his philosophical significance by the most prominent of his English speaking interpreters.