The Cambridge Companion to Keynes

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Roger E. Backhouse and Bradley W. Bateman (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Keynes, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 342pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521840902.

Reviewed by Tarja Knuuttila, University of Helsinki


John Maynard Keynes (1883 -- 1946) is the fourth famous economist to whom a Cambridge Companion has been dedicated. Before The Cambridge Companion to Keynes such collections have been edited on Adam Smith, John Stuart Mill and Karl Marx, of whom the last two are also at least as important as philosophers. As Keynes was without doubt the most influential economist of the twentieth century, a contemporary collection on the different aspects and effects of his work is definitely in order. On the back cover of the book the editors, Roger E. Backhouse and Bradley W. Bateman, claim that "new readers will find [The Cambridge Companion to Keynes] the most convenient, accessible guide to Keynes currently available". However, for those predominantly interested in the recent interpretations of Keynes's economic theory, the contents of the book might prove surprising. Of the fourteen contributions apart from the introduction, which makes the fifteenth, only four directly address his economic theory, two of them deal with the relationship of his work to economic policy and the remaining essays concern his philosophical work (in all four essays, too) and various other aspects of his life. This is definitely an unconventional Keynes for those who have become acquainted with him through the text books in economics. Even Keynes's homosexuality is referred to in several essays and included in the index.

The introduction already prepares the readers for what is to come. Here the editors -- Backhouse specializes in economic methodology and Bateman in the work of Keynes -- portray him as a philosopher turned economist. For Keynes as a young Cambridge student the ideal career would have been to become an artist or a philosopher, but once he started with economics his rise was "meteoric": He soon got good positions and important tasks, and wrote books on highly topical issues.[1] And yet "he was still experiencing doubts about his vocation". These doubts had dissipated by the time Keynes wrote his most important book, The General Theory of Employment, Interest and Money (1936) (hereafter The General Theory). But to understand the overall thrust of Keynes's work as an economist one should keep in mind, the editors stress, that for him pursuing wealth was never an end in itself but a means to a better life in terms of art, beauty and friendship.

Once the stage is set by the introduction, the book opens with four strong essays on the economic theory and methodology of Keynes, written by an interesting collection of distinguished economists and methodologists of economics. In the first of these essays, Roger E. Backhouse charts the history of the reception of Keynes's work since the publication of The General Theory. Backhouse distinguishes between three meanings of the so-called Keynesian revolution, of which the first refers to government policy, second to a specific political philosophy and the third to economic theory. All these aspects of the Keynesian revolution are subsequently dealt with in the various articles of the book, while Backhouse concentrates on economic theory striving to differentiate between Keynesian economics and the economics of Keynes. Whereas Keynes and his contemporaries felt a need for "fresh" economics as opposed to abstract orthodoxy, Keynes's own ideas developed in the hands of his followers, such as John Hicks, Paul Samuelson, Don Patinkin and Franco Modigliani, into another rather abstract orthodoxy, that of Keynesian economics. Backhouse argues that this "neoclassical synthesis" in fact neglected some key insights of Keynes: the idea that there might be an equilibrium in which people were involuntarily unemployed and perhaps most importantly the effects of "risk, uncertainty and ignorance", as Keynes put it. Indeed, the dissenters to mainstream Keynesian economics underlined the importance of uncertainty, time and disequilibrium phenomena for the economics of Keynes. In the face of all these different interpretations of Keynes's work, Backhouse concludes that all of them are justified in the sense that The General Theory encompassed both more traditional and more radical lines of reasoning.

David Laidler, a well-known economist most often associated with the Monetarist tradition, is concerned with breaking the myth of Keynes's central role in the birth of macroeconomics -- to which Keynes himself contributed by downplaying the macroeconomic insights of his classical forefathers. On the other hand, Laidler also points out that Keynes's own work was in turn appropriated by many of his followers in a way that did not recognize the most innovative part of his work. For Laidler, Keynes's most original contribution lies in "the key role that The General Theory attributed to the facts of monetary exchanges and their consequences" and not in introducing discretionary fiscal policy and wage rigidities to the economic theory as it is usually believed. Discretionary fiscal policy and the effects of money wage stickiness were no novelties for the economics community by the time Keynes wrote. Paradoxically, Keynes's focus on the uncertainties and expectations governing the monetary sector, savings and investment had a great effect on Monetarism (although Milton Friedman was not aware of this ), the movement that, later in the 1960s and 1970s, challenged Keynesian economics and partly contributed to its demise.

The author of the influential On Keynesian Economics and the Economics of Keynes (1968), Axel Leijonhufvud, continues Laidler's effort to contextualize Keynes's economics by studying where Keynes parted from Alfred Marshall, his mentor. Leijonhufvud distinguishes between Walrasian and Marshallian models, noting that the most familiar models today descend from Léon Walras. Keynes can be seen as an heir of Marshall although his "claim to greatness", argues Leijonhufvud, "is based on his departures on Marshall". Keynes questioned Marshall in two important respects. Firstly, he broke with Marshall's "continuity principle" which supposed that various economic processes were adaptive and convergent whereas for Keynes expectations could change abruptly and violently, thus disrupting economic behavior. Moreover, Keynes saw that the laws of motion of a single market do not guarantee equilibrium in a highly specialized economy using and requiring money. Thus Leijonhufvud agrees with Laidler on the importance of monetary factors for Keynes's economics. Leijonhufvud closes his article by giving a sketchy account of how the economics of Keynes was "eventually buried under the layers" of Keynesian economics, monetarism, new classical macroeconomics and real business cycle theory.

The last contribution on Keynes's economic theory, "Doctor Keynes" by Kevin D. Hoover, also discusses the Marshallian roots of Keynes's theory. In line with Leijonhufvud, Hoover contrasts the Walrasian and Marshallian styles of economic reasoning. For Hoover the difference between the Walrasian and Marshallian method is that between "a theory that is comprehensive and one that is purpose-built" and he claims that Keynes's attitude to economic theory was rather similar to that of Marshall. Hoover emphasizes the fact that before the publication of The General Theory Keynes was only a part-time academic having many other public roles, ranging from an adviser to a successful player in financial markets to a member of corporate boards. This has left its imprint on his economic theory which Hoover aptly calls "a diagnostic instrument in the service of Dr. Keynes, consulting economic physician". As an example of Keynes's diagnostic practice, Hoover presents a piece of Keynes's causal reasoning concerning the price level fluctuation. Hoover stresses that Keynes is not after a comprehensive theory but rather aims to isolate a causal mechanism, and it is exactly his preference for causal articulation that makes him prefer qualitative to quantitative analysis. Moreover, this is not just a practical question but also a self-conscious choice, on Keynes's part, concerning the limitations of formal reasoning and theorizing.

Interestingly, in one way or another all four of the contributions on Keynes's economic theory and method center on the role of formalizations and models. Each of the authors is in agreement that Keynes was wary of formalizing economic theory since he believed, like Marshall, that economic phenomena were too complex for mathematical models to capture. Yet Keynes's own work fuelled the formalization of economic theory since it led economists to formulate mathematical models in an attempt to find out which were the key assumptions of his theory. One specific model deserves to be mentioned in this respect: the so-called IS-LM model. This model could be used to demonstrate some of Keynes's most important conclusions, yet at the same time it distorted his theory by abstracting away the saving-investment problem that was crucial for Keynes. The story of the IS-LM model illustrates well both the powers and dangers of modeling. Generations of economists got acquainted with Keynes's theory through the textbook versions of the IS-LM model and thus the destiny of Keynes's theory became intertwined with the fate of the IS-LM model. As Leijonhufvud puts it: "The theory had come to be identified with the model, so that the deficiencies of the model became fatal to the theory". As these observations are of interest also from a more general point of view, one certainly hopes that philosophers of science other than those interested in economics will read The Cambridge Companion to Keynes.  

The two contributions on Keynes and economic policy both strive to discredit the view that Keynes and Keynesian economics had a great effect on actual economic policies. Writing about "Keynes and British economic policy" George C. Peden notes that Keynes's name has been used to support and condemn various policies.  Peden presents some evidence concerning Keynes's contacts with policy makers, his "innumerable" polemical newspaper articles and his policy advice concerning public investment, war finance and the emerging Bretton Woods system. Peden paints a picture of a pragmatist economist who relies also on his economic theorizing and is often unsuccessful in his proposals. Bradley W. Bateman also seeks to destabilize what he calls a "stylized history" that conflates Keynes and Keynesianism, and makes Keynes the influential advocate of counter-cyclical fiscal policy and running budget deficits. Bateman notes that Keynes's opinions on economic policy were "fluid", he did not speak for continuous budget deficits, and, what is more, this kind of image of Keynes ignores his interest in monetary policy -- something that Laidler stresses as well. Bateman attributes the worldwide demand management policies to the war economy and the subsequent reconstruction task as well as to the commitment to social benefits. According to Bateman, Keynes was less the cause of those policies than a name around which their successes or failures were consolidated. Linking Keynes's name to these currents provided economists and policymakers alike a common reference point that could unite them in the same enterprise, whether it consisted of speaking for or against countercyclical policy.

The novelty of The Cambridge Companion to Keynes lies in the way it focuses on Keynes also as a philosopher. The contributions on the philosophical aspects of Keynes's work all highlight his interest in ethics and the influence of G. E. Moore on his thinking. Writing about "Keynes and philosophers", Tiziano Raffaelli remarks how Moorian supreme values of love and beauty influenced Keynes's conception of economics as only instrumental to the good life. Keynes was, however, also critical towards Moore, whose conservative conclusion that right action would consist in obeying the customary norms led Keynes to write A Treatise on Probability (1921), which is the other major book of his along with The General Theory. Moore argued, to Keynes's dissatisfaction, that knowledge is never complete enough to guarantee the good results of actions, and that resorting to probability does not change the situation, thus making customary rules of conduct the best option. Yet the probability-relation proposed by Keynes falls back on Moore's (and the early twentieth-century Cambridge's) "naïve epistemology" since Keynes claims that probabilistic knowledge rests on "direct acquaintance" with probability-relations. Consequently, the probability-relation was for Keynes the same kind of unanalyzable notion as good was for Moore. Raffaelli addresses several aspects of Keynes's work on probability including his view that probabilities cannot always be measured, his concept of weight (which is still discussed in relation to probability and risk), and his insistence that risk is irreducible to the numerical calculus. Thus already in his early work on probability, Keynes shows concern with uncertainty, which became one of the cornerstones of his economic outlook. Moreover, in reviewing Keynes's relationship to Wittgenstein, Raffaelli remarks that in comparison to Wittgenstein's stable rules able to take care of themselves, the conventions were artificial and fragile for Keynes.

After the publication of A Treatise on Probability Keynes did not publish much more on the theory of probability. Yet the question of probability emerges again, though indirectly, in The General Theory by way of Keynes's treatment of expectations. Referring to the debate on Keynes's probability theory that took place in the 1980s and 1990s, Donald Gillies asks whether or not Keynes's ideas on probability changed throughout the years. Gillies argues that Frank Ramsey's criticism made Keynes move to an intermediate position between his earlier logical interpretation of probability and Ramsey's subjective theory of probability. Yet granting that Keynes did not explicitly write about probability in his later work raises the question of what kind of position he could have held. Gillies develops an intersubjective theory of probability making use of Keynes's views on the long-time expectations of entrepreneurs. Because of a lack of information and general uncertainty, entrepreneurs tend to imitate each other, thus following the herd and giving rise to the famous "animal spirits" to which Keynes attributes the often abrupt changes in economic activity.

Thomas Baldwin takes a look at Keynes's ethical views, focusing on the influence of G. E. Moore on Keynes and his contemporaries. As such, Baldwin's article concentrates on the most unknown side of Keynes, taking up, for example, a "remarkable but unappreciated episode in Keynes's thought in which he first developed and then abandoned, an ethical theory that is in some respects a significant improvement on Moore's theory". In the ethical treatise "Miscellanea ethica", which is inspired also by Brentano, Keynes separates the fitness of things from the goodness of things. He conceives the goodness of things in terms of fitness, which is inherently relational, that is, fitness to be loved or admired, for example. Baldwin argues that young Keynes's way of thinking in "Miscellanea ethica" has a contemporary flavor, and he compares Keynes's views with those of Tim Scanlon.[2] Later, Keynes reconverted to his earlier Moorean faith, but he retained his conviction that only feelings or states of consciousness can be intrinsically good. This position, Baldwin remarks, became orthodoxy among the members of the Bloomsbury Group.

Writing about Keynes's "political philosophy", Samuel Brittan makes the interesting claim that Keynes's advocacy for government intervention and demand management policies should be contextualized to the political situation of the early twentieth century, when the politicians and civil servants were still relatively free from political pressures of various kinds. Had Keynes lived long enough to see democratic politics develop into "auction for votes", he would certainly have believed less in governmental planning and intervention, argues Brittan. In the interwar political situation, Keynes's position was somewhere between laissez-faire capitalism and state socialism. For Keynes, tackling the economic problems meant a better society, a society in which a greater number of people could concentrate on the matters of supreme value. His dislike of money as motive, Brittan points out, was common among well-off Oxbridge intellectuals, but unlike them, Keynes also had "a strong personal interest in the detailed processes of money-making in the City".

After the high expectations awakened by the fascinating essays on Keynes's economic theory and method, the part of The Cambridge Companion to Keynes that focuses on the philosophical aspects of Keynes's work appears somewhat colorless. This cannot be attributed to the contributions themselves but rather to the fact that of Keynes's early writings on philosophy only those on probability are of contemporary interest. It is, however, worth noting how well the various writings on Keynes's economics and on his philosophical views cohere with each other. This impression is further strengthened by those contributions of the book that depict both him and the social circles in which he lived his life.

Who was Keynes, then, the economist despite himself? Keynes's many interests and his philosophical and ethical inclinations are made more comprehensible by two more biographical contributions which place Keynes in the context of his colleagues and friends. Maria Cristina Marcuzzo writes about Keynes's relationship to Cambridge, where he acted both as an undergraduate student and as a scholar. Even though Keynes never held a professorship in Cambridge, Marcuzzo claims that he "was economics in Cambridge" in the same way as Marshall had been. Marcuzzo discusses Keynes's relationship to his colleagues, many of them important economists, and describes their divided reception of The General Theory. Craufurd D. Goodwin in turn seeks to elucidate how Keynes's personal life and professional opinions were affected by the Bloomsbury group of artists and writers. He points out that Keynes, in contrast to the classical economists, was more interested in how to deal with abundance than with scarcity. The question of Keynes and the other members of the Bloomsbury group of how to lead a virtuous life in a consumer society is even more vital to us today. Goodwin also draws intriguing parallels between the artistic and historical work of the members of the Bloomsbury group and the economics of Keynes. One important common topic for both Keynes and the other Bloomsburians was the theme of inconsistent expectations that in the economic theory of Keynes was formulated in terms of the uncertainty of the future.

There are two other essays in the book. D.E. Moggridge, who has written an extensive biography of Keynes,[3] writes about his massive correspondence, a correspondence much larger than that of any other economist. Moggridge focuses on two particular examples: his wartime correspondence with Dennis Robertson, a younger Cambridge colleague of his, and his correspondence with his publishers dealing with the unusual publishing arrangements he had with them. The only somewhat puzzling contribution to the book is that of Matthias Klaes, who asks whether Keynes was a modernist, given that he belonged to "London-centred high-modernist movement around the Bloomsbury Group", or perhaps rather a postmodernist, since he criticized the neoclassical paradigm in economics which some discussants concerned with the so-called rhetoric of economics have characterized as "economic modernism". One wonders whether too much is made here of Keynes's being a member of the Bloomsbury group. Klaes concludes that Keynes was lying somewhere between modernism and postmodernism, and he also pays attention to Keynes's accomplishments as a writer.

All in all, the common themes of the book -- undermining different popular myths concerning Keynes, distinguishing between the economics of Keynes and Keynesian economics, and identifying, once again, his most original economic and other contributions -- suggests that apart from giving an "accessible guide to Keynes" The Cambridge Companion to Keynes seeks also to rehabilitate Keynes's work that from the point of view of the current mainstream economics seems already superseded. One objective of the book is certainly also  that of tracing, in the editors' words, "in the complexity of [Keynes's] life, the forces that shaped a man and his moral commitments, which in turn motivated his economics". In all these respects, The Cambridge Companion to Keynes has certainly succeeded.

[1] Indian Currency and Finance (1913), Economic Consequences of the Peace (1919).

[2] Scanlon, Tim (1998), What We Owe to Each Other. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

[3] Moggridge, D.E. (1992), Maynard Keynes. An Economist's Biography. London: Routledge.