The Cambridge Companion to Medieval Jewish Philosophy

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Daniel F. Frank and Oliver Leaman, eds., The Cambridge Companion to Medieval Jewish Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2003, 508pp, $27.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521655749

Reviewed by Jerome Gellman, Ben-Gurion University of the Negev


An austerely historical approach to Jewish philosophy characterizes this volume of an introduction plus seventeen articles on medieval Jewish philosophy. For sure, since the articles refer to a long-gone historical period, we should expect careful historical positioning of the material as well as expect to be informed of influences between Jewish philosophers, and between Jewish philosophers and others. However, this volume is oriented to questions of historical influence to a fault. I say this with a high regard for the articles published here. They are uniformly outstanding, highly learned and display great expertise. Yet the overall impression is that the soul of medieval Jewish philosophy is largely missing from this book.

Almost all the articles have titles about “who influenced whom.” For examples, the two articles on Maimonides, one by Daniel Frank and the other by Tzvi Langerman (see more on them below), are, respectively, on the Aristotelian impact and on the influence of the sciences on Maimonides. The impressive article on Saadya, by Sarah Strousma, is about the kalam influence; the one on ibn Gabirol and Isaac Israeli, by Sarah Pessin, is on Neo-Platonist influence on them. There are two (!) articles on the influence of Averroes on Jewish thought, one by Steven Harvey and the second by Gregg Stern; one article on the impact of Scholasticism on fourteenth and fifteenth century Jewish thought, by Tamar Rudavsky. There is an insightful article on the influences between kabbalah and philosophy, by Hava Tirosh-Samuelson, and one on co-influences between Judaism and Sufism, by Paul Fenton. The article by Barry Kogan, the expert on Yehuda Halevi, focuses on Halevi’s “use of philosophy.” An article by David Shatz, is dedicated to the Biblical and Rabbinic “background,” and the last article is entitled “The End and Aftereffects of Medieval Jewish Philosophy,” by Seymour Feldman.

Of the seventeen articles, only one is given a thematic title, the one by Menachem Lorberbaum on medieval Jewish political thought. Lorberbaum focuses instructively on Halevi’s “anti-politics” and on Maimonides’ political philosophy of law. Lorberbaum shows how these antithetical approaches work themselves out broadly in medieval Jewish philosophy, and beyond to Spinoza. This article is a paradigm for what the reader could have expected across the board.

Three other articles, despite not having thematic titles, succeed in overcoming the “who did what to whom” syndrome. Charles Manekin’s deeply philosophical treatment of Gersonides portrays a Jewish medieval figure troubled by a panoply of philosophical problems and dealing with them the best he could. Here we see Gersonides’ concern with personal survival, divine providence, scriptural authority, creation, and God’s knowledge of particulars. All live issues in medieval philosophy. No other article in this volume treats a medieval figure in a similarly broad fashion.

Tamar Rudavsky’s brilliant article, under the guise of writing about the Scholastic impact of Jewish philosophy in the fourteenth and fifteenth centuries, deals with the problem of omniscience and human freedom, determinism, theories of individuation, and eternity and creation, graciously referring abundantly to recent scholarship.

Thirdly, David Shatz’s article, under the cover of the topic of Rabbinic influence, gives a sophisticated accounting of how Maimonides in particular, and Jewish medieval philosophy in general, dealt with the problem of scriptural authority and its philosophical exegesis. Crucial here was a philosophical reinterpretation of the Talmudic dictum that “The Torah speaks in the language of human beings,” from being an apologetic for Biblical colloquialisms to a principle of non-philosophical biblical expressions having to yield to philosophical truths.

The overwhelmingly narrow focus of this collection causes serious lacunae. “Evil” gets mentioned (not discussed!) three times in this entire book, two of them in connection with kabbalah. There is no discussion here of the problem of evil in Jewish medieval philosophy. In addition, particularly Jewish philosophical concerns are grossly under-represented. There is no article giving a systematic treatment of the topic of biblical miracles in Jewish medieval philosophy. The election of Israel does not merit more than one mention, and not much attention is paid to the serious question of the place of the commandments in the philosophical life. This near silence on specifically Jewish philosophical issues reflects, from yet a different vantage point, the dominant mood here.

To understand what should have been done in this volume, compare it to the Cambridge Companion to Medieval Philosophy. There we find a section on “Medieval Philosophy in Context,” which deals with historical influences. This is then accompanied by an abundance of thematic sections devoted, respectively, to such topics as language and logic, God and being, creation and nature, human nature, the moral life, and ultimate goodness. The contrast between the two volumes could not be more striking.

In his introduction, Oliver Leaman lists the two main contributions, to his mind, of medieval Jewish philosophy, neither of which, it turns out, have anything to do with the ideas to be found therein. The first is that Jewish philosophy served as a bridge between Islamic and Greek philosophy, on the one hand, and Christian philosophy, on the other. The other is that Jewish philosophy influenced Jewish thought as a whole, which in turn enabled the Jews to have a large effect on the development of culture in general, through the “overrepresentation of Jews in public and intellectual life.” (p. 6).

At the very least, Jewish medieval philosophy had a strong influence on philosophy through Maimonides. Maimonides gave the world the classical philosophical formulation of the via negativa approach to God, and served as a model for philosophical inquiry informed by religious commitment. He was Aquinas’ “Rabbi Moses,” and strongly influenced Meister Eckhart and later philosophical mysticism. He had great influence on Spinoza, regarding both what Spinoza accepted and felt compelled to reject, and through Spinoza on modern philosophy. Solomon Ibn Gvirol’s work, known as Fons Vitae to the Christian medieval philosophers (who did not know that he was the author), was a major contribution to neo-Platonic philosophy. And so on. If the contributors to this volume, the leading thinkers in the area, share the sentiments of Leaman, the time has come to rethink most seriously the enterprise of medieval Jewish philosophy.

There are two surprises in this book, relative to the prevailing mainstream of scholarship, both in the articles about Maimonides. Daniel Frank addresses the standard difference between the dualists, who see two “Maimonideses”: one the esoteric Aristotelian, and the other the exoteric pious Jew, and the “coherentists,” who see a seamless Maimonides. Frank comes down solidly on the coherentist side, echoing Ralph McInerny’s understanding of Aquinas, that the latter was using the language of Aristotle for his own purpose, but was not an “Aristotelian.” Maimonides’ Aristotelianism, believes Frank, always had to answer to Maimonides’ conviction of an historical revelation Therefore, Frank takes Maimonides at face value when he departs from orthodox Aristotelian teachings in favor of traditional Jewish ones: concerning his not being convinced by the arguments for the world’s eternity, his not taking prophecy as an entirely natural phenomenon, and his tempering his elitist intellectualism by mandating moral and political action.

The second surprise is in Tzvi Langerman’s piece on Maimonides and the sciences. Scholars are divided over whether Maimonides believed miracles were possible at all or whether he merely severely restricted their occurrence. Langerman offers a novel approach. When Maimonides was young, Langerman writes, and impressed by the “scientific enterprise,” he rejected miracles when understood as interventions into the natural order. As Maimonides matured, however, he “became more receptive to the need for miracles as well as their possibility,” (p. 173) because of dampened enthusiasm for the explanatory power of science. Instead, Maimonides countenances deviations from a fixed order due to the activity of the “divine will” in the world.

The theses of Frank and Langerman beg further elucidation. Regarding Frank, we want to know how the proposed Maimonidean positions, entailing an active divine will, can square with Maimonides’ via negativa conception of God. In particular, we want to know how Maimonides could have thought of the “divine will” as an efficient, rather than a final cause of world events, given what appears to be his view of God. Regarding Langerman, Maimonides could not have simply changed his mind about miracles without that having reverberations for his concept of God. Since it is hard to detect such a change in the latter, it might be more plausible to suggest that what changed was not Maimonides’ view of miracles, but his view of what beliefs were necessary, in his technical sense.

To conclude: This is a most impressive collection of articles, with a keenly historical approach to medieval Jewish philosophy, more fitting, however, for a volume on the “history of medieval Jewish philosophy,” than for a Cambridge “companion” to medieval Jewish philosophy.