The Cambridge Companion to Medieval Logic

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Catarina Dutilh Novaes and Stephen Read (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Medieval Logic, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 450pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107656673.

Reviewed by Allan Bäck, Kutztown University


This book offers a survey of a lot of the current research in medieval logic today. The blurb says, "It will be a must-read for students and scholars of medieval philosophy, the history of logic, and the history of ideas."

However, I would say that much of this book is accessible only to those with considerable background in this area. Some of the essays are more or less accessible to a general audience. Others would be quite hard to follow for those with little background: for example, 'syncategorematic' (21) and "Boethius' thesis" (72) are introduced without prior explanation; the discussion of consequences sometimes seems incomplete, and the reference to the Categories is never explained (335-8); the tables of propositions in Chapter 14 need more explanation. All this was fascinating for me but likely far beyond a beginner. Other essays, like those on early Latin logic and on sophisms, seem to have been written much more carefully with the beginner in mind. The technical vocabulary could have been explained by a glossary or just by bolding some page numbers in the index entries. (The book has a lot of cross-referencing, which also could have been done far more succinctly by numbers or just by leaving it to the Index.). Ian Wilk's remark about his own essay applies to the volume as a whole: "What it does not offer is an accessible point of entry into the field for the non-logician". (117) For another example, consider "the expository syllogism". (150; 178)

This Companion is yet another handbook joining the crowded herd. Despite its special focus on medieval logic, much of the material presented here is covered in other handbooks, perhaps because many of the contributors have written for those other volumes.

The book has the distinctive feature of giving weight to both Latin and Arabic materials, although more so to the Latin, where there has been more research. The book has two main parts: Traditions and Themes. I thought that these would divide into history and logic, but in fact Themes chapters have a lot of history, often going over again topics treated in earlier Traditions chapters. (For instance, Chapter 8 mirrors much of Chapters 4 and 5.) The editors give an elaborate defense of their method and their rationale for excluding some areas, like the analysis of exponibles and Arabic formal dialectic (which could have appeared as the Arabic foil in the obligationes chapter).  The Introduction ends with a brief survey of the history of the history of logic, with significant gaps -- where are Prantl and Dumitriu, for better or for worse?

The first essay deals with the reception of materials from ancient logic into the medieval period, Latin and Arabic. Julie Brumberg-Chaumont focuses on the history of the translation of ancient texts. Most of the texts translated were Aristotelian, although some were Stoic and Platonic. She mostly inventories what translations of what texts, along with attendant companion texts and summaries, were available at what times and locales. The Latin West had only a few treatises of Aristotle, along with Boethius' commentaries, and some grammars like Priscian's, until about the thirteenth century: the logica vetus. Then the full Organon of Aristotle was received along with some Greek commentaries and Arabic commentaries by Averroes and Avicenna: the logica moderna (nova). In contrast, the Arabic world had the full corpus of Aristotle with Greek commentaries nearly from the start. One major vehicle was a translation of Aristotle along with marginalia quoting from commentaries, which seems to have been a major source for Avicenna and others. (41; 46-7)

The second essay, by Ahmad Haswani and Wilfrid Hodges, deals with Arabic logic before Avicenna. It repeats the previous essay a bit, but with more detail. The authors then discuss the writings of Islamic philosophers like Avicenna. They make the usual claim that Avicenna gives the Aristotelian Peripatetic treatment in the large Shifāʾ, while in his later writings he gives his own views "without making concessions to the Peripatetics."(50-1) I would have liked some specifics here, as I see in Avicenna's later works mostly only simplified accounts of the earlier materials. (The same issue arises in a Themes chapter, which takes the logic primers of the madrasa schools as the "culmination" of the logical tradition. (350) I hope that future historians will be kinder to us and our textbooks, and not take them as the culmination of logic today!! Hasnawi and Hodges then turn to innovations in the Arabic logicians. Al-Fārābī discusses Aristotle's Topics within the syllogistic of the Prior Analytics in order to give methods for hitting upon the middle terms (52-3), but here he is following some remarks in the Greek commentators. Avicenna hits upon them by various activities, including "wine drinking, prayer and sleep" (54), although the authors fail to mention Avicenna's main account (Burhān 257, 2-12; Kitàb an-Nafs, V.4), where the philosopher with purified intellect gains access to the quiddities themselves. Fārābī and Avicenna focus on definition and demonstration. One original logical doctrine was Avicenna's analysis of statements in terms of when and how long things had the properties signified by their subject and predicate terms, and whether they had them necessarily or not. Avicenna then applies these analyses to syllogisms, categorical, modal, and hypothetical.

Khaled El- Rouayheb discusses Arabic logic after Avicenna. Here the focus shifted from commenting on the Organon to the newer focus on definition and demonstration. Focusing on works like Avicenna's late summary of logic, in Al-Ishārāt, the works were mostly handbooks and epitomes, glosses and superglosses. El-Rouayheb says that De Morgan's laws were recognized "at least since Khūnajī", but they are clearly already in Avicenna's Al-'Ibra,. He then has a rather technical discussion of various analyses of temporalized and modalized propositions and contrapositives, on the essential and the externalist readings, which I think even specialists would labor to follow. Later centuries offered analyses of problems like the liar paradox. It's hard to determine how original or profound these discussions were without more details about earlier theories, especially those of Avicenna.

Ian Wilks deals with Latin logic up to the 12th century. At first, the central texts were not by Aristotle but by later authors like Cicero, Augustine, and Porphyry; Eriugena focused on the structure of division in Neoplatonic emanation. Often the logic seems bad. As Wilks remarks, Notker had not figured out how to negate a conditional; later logicians had the correct account, although I can think of some further howlers by Garlandus that Wilks does not mention. We get to some better logic with Anselm on paronymy and above all with Abelard, "the first colossus", on both semantics and syntax, as with hypothetical conditionals. Although Wilks does not explain Chris Martin's contention that Abelard's project failed, he proceeds to discuss various later logical schools reacting to Abelard.

Sara Uckelman and Henrik Lagerland discuss logic in the Latin West in the 13th century, when Latin translations of Aristotle's corpus and its attendant Greek and Arabic commentaries became widely available. The authors bring up the division between the traditions at Oxford and Paris -- a recurrent theme in this Companion, although I don't find the contrast ever stated clearly. As Uckelman and Lagerland note, Kilwardby has many of the leading original ideas in logic in this period, although Albert the Great gets credit for them. They make similar claims for the originality of Averroes. Here I demur, and they eventually concur a bit, as Averroes often is copying Alexander or rehashing ideas from Avicenna, e.g., on mixed modal syllogisms. Kilwardby too seems to have Avicenna's two readings of propositions, the "essentialist" and the "externalist' perhaps. (130-1) In this period of logical fecundity, the authors focus on the syncategoremata and the grammatical tradition of the modistae. They end by discussing the Condemnation of 1277 of certain doctrines, even logical ones, as heretical. They mention the claim that the Condemnation "paved the way for the birth of modern science", without explaining it. (140)

Next, Stephen Read discusses the 14th century, where at first logical innovation centered at Oxford with Burley and Ockham, and the Mertonian calculators with their sophisms and their emphasis on problems about motion. Later in the century, logical activity spread, first to Paris, above all with Buridan, and later, with the proliferation of universities and the dispersions to southern France and Eastern Europe caused by the Black Death and the Counter-Papacy.  Logical theory entered into the dispute between nominalists and realists, although Read does not discuss how logical sophisms became crucial test cases in that debate.

E. Jennifer Ashworth discusses the continuation of logic up to the mid 16th century. (I would have at least mentioned John of St. Thomas (Poinsot) in the next century, who follows De Soto closely, along with the continuing proliferation of scholastic textbooks.) The printing press enabled wider access to current and earlier writings, including, with the Renaissance, original Greek texts, Platonist as well as Aristotelian. Paul of Venice wrote the Logica Magna, the largest logic book ever, but much of it seems to have been copied from earlier sources. Religious controversies, within Catholicism and between Catholics and Protestants, led to some persecution of logicians and their texts, notably followers of Wycliff and the nominalists. (170-2) There was new work in supposition theory and on "notions", but there was also growing humanist impatience with the quibbles of medieval logic.

In the second half of the book (the Themes), the pretense of giving equal weight to what we know of the Latin and Arabic traditions is sometimes given short shrift, depending on the authors. For instance, the sections on modality and syllogism do discuss both traditions. However, those on the proposition and obligationes do not, even though the materials, both primary and secondary, are available. (For the obligationes, since the authors admit a juridical connection for the obligationes, the natural parallel would be Islamic Kalām and jurisprudence.

Going over some of the ground previously covered, Margaret Cameron discusses the Logica Vetus. So we get again the Isagoge and realism versus nominalism. Cameron discusses the view of logic as a science of second intentions without mentioning Avicenna! So too for the theory of intellective cognition in Nicholas of Paris et al.: no Avicenna or even Aristotle. (Once again the imbalance between the Latin and the Arabic . . . .) Olivi's taking the categories as modes looks quite interesting, but is relegated to n. 12. The use of "forms' in the literature on the Book of Six Principles strikes me again not as not particularly original but as based upon Aristotle's theory of perception, as Cameron's remark on natural science may indicate.

We get more originality in Christoph Kann's essay on the later theory of supposition and other properties of terms. Kann discusses the varied history of supposition and appellation, although not their Greek roots.  At first, supposition differed greatly from signification, rather like meaning versus reference. Later, with nominalists like Ockham, the two merge: a term comes to signify what it stands for, the objects being referred to. Likewise, although at first different types of supposition stood for different types of things.  As 'human' can stand for individual humans (personal), the species (simple), or the word ('human), the nominalists tended to reduce all to personal supposition: to individual men, to individual concepts or acts of thinking, or to the individual tokens, spoken or written, of words. (226-7) Kann notes that the theory of supposition tended to assimilate that of appellation. I would suggest this comes from applying supposition theory to the conversion of propositions in the syllogistic, which requires the interchange of the subject and predicate terms. Kann also goes into some detail about subdivisions of personal supposition, and explains why supposition is not the same as modern reference.

Laurant Cesalli discusses the proposition and contrasts the medieval conception from the "contemporary". To my surprise, Cesalli means those in the 19th century like Bolzano, Brentano, and Frege. (246 n. 2) The medievals see a proposition as a string of words that can be true or false. The moderns see it as a Platonist "abstract entity", which is neither a string of words nor a mental entity. This doesn't sound much like propositions as they function in uninterpreted formal logic today! Anyway, later on, Cesalli discusses medievals like Abelard, who has a similar "abstract entity" view, and Aquinas, who takes a proposition as a mental entity. Abelard takes a proposition to signify a dictum, which is independent of what exists in re. The proposition, the dictum that, if something is a rose, it is a flower, is true, necessarily, even if there are no roses. Ockham too speaks of mental propositions. Later theories have a complexe significabile, which is neither mental nor in re, and which Cesali discusses, well, complexly.

Mikko Yrjönsuuri's essay on sophisms is much easier to follow. Sophisms present logical puzzles in the standard format of the quaestio, which is used in commentaries on Lombard's Sentences. Sophisms were used to teach and to develop theory, in a way not too different than in Montague today. Medievals would unpack complex sentences containing expressions like 'begins' and 'insofar as', and speak of their "presuppositions," similar to theorists today. The humanists in the Renaissance especially disliked sophisms. Yet they find their way into modern times, influencing theories of motion in 17th century physics, and into Don Quixote. Sophisms of knowledge have surfaced today with Curry's paradox and with various treatments of the scope of the epistemic operators.

Paul Thom gives a balanced treatment of the syllogism, Arabic and Latin. Defining the syllogism was a common problem. In the Arabic tradition, concern centered on how different the conclusion had to be from the premises. Avicenna's definition, a simplified version of it in his later Ishārāt, became the standard, although Averroes returns to Aristotle (and, I would say, to Alexander. In the Latin West, Kilwardby also banishes redundant conclusions for syllogisms, although on slightly different grounds. Later logicians like Ockham allowed for more redundancy. Thom also compares the Arabic and Latin traditions on arguing through syllogisms with impossible, logically contradictory premises. Again there is overlap of doctrines, although the historical influences are hard to make out.

Gyula Klima deals with consequences, namely, non-syllogistical inferences, from the Latin tradition only. Abelard had developed a propositional logic, which could handle (some of!) them. However he made mistakes in applying it to conditional propositions. Different authors had different conceptions of consequences. One major, later division was into formal and material consequences, where the former use only the logical structure of the premises to infer, while the latter appeal to the material content of their terms as well, as with induction. Klima jumps from the 12th to the 14th centuries, but then fills in some of the gaps later. He compares the medieval project of partially regimenting natural language to Montague's project today of partially formalizing it. (328; 348)

The essay on modal logic by Riccardo Strobino and Paul Thom again treats both Arabic and Latin theories. It has some overlap with the two Traditions essays on Arabic logic. I was surprised to see the authors claim that Avicenna focuses on the one-sided possible (not impossible] and not the two-sided [not impossible and not necessary], as he says in Al-'Ibra and Al-Qīyās (33,11-5; 164,12-7) and also in Al-Ishārāt (I.IV.3, 272; trans. Inati p. 95) that the latter is right, while the former is fit only for the common people. They also give some elaborate classifications of types of modal propositions in Avicenna and in al-Kātibī. Strobino and Thom see two main Latin traditions. Abelard and Kilwardby belong to an essentialist tradition, where modal truth is determined by what real objects have what sorts of attributes. In contrast, Ockham and Buridan belong to an existentialist tradition, where the conceptual relations between the terms of the propositions determine modal truth, with the added proviso that, in the divided sense, where the modality has scope over the predicate only, affirmative propositions also must have an existential import assumption. Otherwise, in order to be true, they should be taken not as 'every S is necessarily P', but as 'if something is S, it is necessarily P'.

The last essay, by Catarina Dutilh Novaes and Sara Uckelman, deals with obligationes, which are uniquely Latin: puzzling logical games for philosophical jousting with varying rules. The authors give a good account of the structure of one such game. Obligationes seem to have served much the same functions as sophisms, discussed in a previous essay. Some of the cases on truth resemble Moore's and Fitch's paradoxes today. The obligationes often have "a juridical ring" (383; 393), and so, once again, I wonder, why not discuss Arabic legal dialectic too? The related work in Aristotle's Topics was not discussed explicitly in this literature until the 13th century. In the next century, along with emphasis on the theory of consequences, obligationes became quite important. By the Renaissance, they became important mainly to ridicule, as Vivès did generally with doctrines given by Lax and Dullaert.

The book is well produced but does have some typos, a few flagrant. For instance, "Burley was born in Yorkshire in England around 1375, studied at Oxford . . . in the later 1290s . . . " (143). Also Table 10.1 seems to have some major flaws.