The Cambridge Companion to Montaigne

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Ullrich Langer (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Montaigne, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 266pp, $22.99 (pbk), ISBN 052152556X.

Reviewed by David Lewis Schaefer, Holy Cross College


Montaigne's Essays (1580-1592) is one of the most widely read, but also most puzzling, books of the French literary and philosophical canon. Indeed, its overtly unsystematic character makes its very status as a work of "philosophy" doubtful in the eyes of many scholars. Its 107 chapters, divided into three books, address a practically infinite variety of subjects, ranging from "Thumbs" to "Sleep" to "The Useful and the Honorable," in no evident order. Montaigne himself denies being a philosopher at one point, and elsewhere admits to being only an "unpremeditated and accidental" one. And in his preface "To the Reader," while professing that he has written the book "in good faith," or honestly, he also warns readers not to waste their time reading it, claiming that it is merely a record of his habits and vacillating thoughts intended for his friends and relatives. Thus, at the outset of the Essays, he compels the thoughtful reader to choose between two alternatives: either put down the book at the start, trusting the author's assurance that that there is no point to reading any further; or else doubt the author's frequently professed "good faith" from the outset.

Judging from the acclaim with which the Essays has been met from the time of its first publication, not many readers chose the first option. Many, indeed, have found it a treasure trove of wisdom. Yet there are at least two reasons why a work like this, especially after the passage of more than four centuries, might be thought to invite supplementation by a "companion" for the initial reader. A companion should provide the reader with essential information that would make the Essays more readily accessible: some basic biographical information about the man and his times; some attempt to explain the book's overall character and organization (if any); and perhaps a few words about its influence. Additionally, it ought to give the reader some incentive to tackle the book -- especially since its opening chapter is one of the most obscure and seemingly pointless of the entire work. Above all, a proper companion should offer some account of what makes the Essays worth reading -- what we might expect to learn from it that matters for our own lives. For readers already familiar with the Essays, a written companion might also be of value if it induces them to rethink what they have read, motivating them to return to the book with fresh questions in mind.

The dustjacket of this collection of newly commissioned essays by prominent Montaigne scholars indeed advertises that it offers new readers "the most convenient, accessible guide to Montaigne currently available" as well as providing "advanced students and specialists … a conspectus of recent developments in the interpretation of" the Essays. Unfortunately, the latter goal seems to have been pursued at the expense of the former. Simply put, rather than serving "to dispel the intimidation" that "students and non-specialists often feel when faced with the work of a difficult and challenging thinker," the proclaimed goal of the series of which it forms a part, this volume threatens to erect a barrier between the Essays and its prospective readers. None of the contributions offers a serious appreciation of the Essays as a philosophic work that might still teach readers of the present day "lessons" that are not already familiar to them. Nor do any of them offer a plausible account of the book's plan that might enhance its accessibility.

This is not to deny that a couple of the contributions to this collection -- Tom Conley's "The Essays and the New World," and George Hoffman's "The Investigation of Nature" -- offer real scholarly insights that contribute importantly to our understanding of the Essays, even though both are more suited for the advanced student than the reader first encountering Montaigne. In the course of arguing that the Essays provide "perhaps the first and greatest reflections on the impact of the discovery and colonization of the New World upon Europe and early modern consciousness" (referring particularly to Essays I.31 and III.6), Conley makes an interesting observation on how Montaigne cut off a quotation from Lopez de G—mara's Life of Cortez so as to alter its import, and offers a provocative analysis of some of the "ambitious subtleties" (here, puns with a concealed political point) in "Of Coaches" (84-87). For his part, Hoffman takes seriously Montaigne's claim to be a "naturalist" (in contrast to the received assumption nowadays that the essayist was an anti-scientific skeptic) and compares his views on the study of nature with both the medical science of his era and the Epicurean materialism on which he draws. Hoffman interestingly suggests that Montaigne's "originality" in this area came from the way he "used Lucretius' De rerum natura to undermine [contemporary] naturalists' assumptions concerning causality while nonetheless retaining their anti-teleological thrust," thereby anticipating Descartes' project in his Discourse on Method and Meditations (177). The contributions by Conley and Hoffman alone, I am tempted to say, make this volume worth purchasing.

Other essays, alas, aside from some occasionally helpful background information, constitute neither a usable vade mecum for students and other new readers nor a significant new contribution to Montaigne scholarship. Ullrich Langer's essay on "Montaigne's Political and Religious Context" provides a useful brief sketch of the religious wars that France underwent for most of Montaigne's lifetime, certainly a major concern in the Essays, but treats Montaigne merely as a "bourgeois gentleman," without addressing the relation of his thought and activities to the religious-political crisis. Warren Boutcher's "Montaigne's Legacy" focuses on "the norms of patron-authorship in Montaigne's culture" as the key to understanding his ostensible self-portrait. Like Langer, Boutcher largely reduces Montaigne to a creature of his class and context, claiming that the essayist intended to be the "patron saint" only of "the well-born person's liberty of speech and thought" (49 [emphasis added]), contrary to Montaigne's explicit espousals of liberation for humanity in general, the cause for which Boutcher acknowledges later generations have come to recognize him (48). Even while acknowledging that Montaigne "had to be very careful about how" he communicated any heterodox thoughts, Boucher is himself remarkably credulous in buying the essayist's convoluted and humorous account of how he happened to come across and translate Raymond Sebond's Book of Creatures, the putative defense of which is the theme of the longest chapter of the Essays.

In his essay on "Montaigne and Antiquity," John O'Brien wisely observes that "ideally each Latin quotation cited by Montaigne should be compared with its original context" to see how the essayist may have transformed its meaning. (The same is equally true, of course, of his Greek quotations as well.) However, O'Brien himself merely describes Montaigne's "inventiveness in shaping inherited forms" to accommodate his project (65), without advancing any substantive understanding of the relation of the essayist's thought to that of antiquity. Similarly, while AndrŽ Tournon, in "Justice and the Law: On the Reverse Side of the Essays," offers some interesting background on the status of law in sixteenth-century France, he entirely misses the irony of Montaigne's claim that laws achieve their proper respect only when their origin, or the fact that that they were ever different, has been forgotten. Tournon thinks it "perfectly logical" for Montaigne to have believed both that inherited laws lack "rational justifications" and are "wanting in equity," and that they should ordinarily be maintained "without modification" (101). (If Montaigne had really wanted to persuade his readers to adopt a posture of extreme conservatism towards laws, highlighting their irrationality and iniquity would hardly have been the way to do it!)

In "Montaigne and the Notion of Prudence," Francis Goyet properly challenges the "post-modernist" representation of Montaigne as such an extreme Pyrrhonian skeptic that he was incapable of any action -- hence his supposed "conservatism" (119). In fact, as Goyet notes, Montaigne endeavors in the Essays to act as a kind of director or reformer of his audience's "conscience" (121). Yet the radical critique of Christian theology in the "Apology for Raymond Sebond" (among other places) makes it hardly credible that his reformative intention was "fairly Jesuit" in its character (122), "in the spirit of the Council of Trent" (136), or grounded in "faith in God, in his clan, in the nobility of the French aristocracy" (137), as Goyet maintains. Similarly, while Ian Maclean, in "Montaigne and the Truth of the Schools," acknowledges that professions of sincerity (such as Montaigne's own) can be misleading, and trenchantly observes that the essayist "was one of the few men of his generation to describe Machiavelli's recommendation of unscrupulous and deceitful political behavior as 'solid'" (151), this appreciation in no way carries over into Maclean's own interpretation of the essayist as at most an "accidental and unpremeditated" philosopher. Hence Maclean takes Montaigne's mockery of the scholastic, pseudo-Aristotelian jargon of his era to signify that the essayist was "programmatically unphilosophical" (143). In other words, whereas Montaigne actually sought to restore an understanding of philosophy in its proper sense as an inherently "skeptical," or questioning rather than dogmatic, enterprise, describing even Aristotle's writings as "Pyrrhonism in an affirmative form" (Essays II.12, trans. Donald Frame [Stanford, 1957], 376), Maclean thinks that his critique of Scholasticism was directed against philosophy itself, and thus finds it ironic that the essayist acknowledged in the end having "become" a philosopher by accident (158).

Hardly more satisfactory is Ann Hartle's treatment of Montaigne's thought in "Montaigne and Skepticism." At least Hartle, after observing the contrast between the essayist's professed skepticism and the "credulity" he seems to display in recounting as if true fantastic stories drawn from such sources as Plutarch's dialogues, acknowledges that his repetition of those stories need not signify his own belief in them (190, 193). And she cites a couple of the passages in which Montaigne openly expresses a politically and morally liberating intent, contrary to his professed "conservatism" -- though she oddly concludes that these passages signify his "openness" only to "the unpredictable chance for freedom," rather than "projects of rational reform" (195-6). But Hartle herself proves to be strikingly credulous in taking at face value the essayist's professions of Catholic faith, despite the massive antitheological argument (sometimes concealed as antiphilosophic argument) of the "Apology" and other chapters (200, 203-4), which led to the placement of the Essays on the Catholic Church's Index of prohibited books for several centuries. (For a fuller critique of Hartle's position, see my review of her book Michele de Montaigne: Accidental Philosopher, in Review of Politics, Summer, 2004.)

The final contribution, by J.B. Schneewind, "Montaigne on Moral Philosophy and the Good Life," offers a useful brief summary of Raymond Sebond's chief arguments and Montaigne's responses to them. Schneewind properly highlights Montaigne's anticipation of Hobbes and Locke in his denial that human life is directed towards a single "highest good" (219-220). And he recognizes that Montaigne does not ultimately agree with the Senecan remarks he quotes to the effect that human beings must aspire to transcend their natural condition (223). But Schneewind, like Hartle, misses the antitheological and anti-Christian import of Montaigne's ostensible rejection of the "Stoical" teaching. Contrary to Schneewind, it is not the case that the classical philosophers as a whole taught "that there is just one sure path" to the highest good (219) -- or even that there is unambiguously only one ultimate good for all human beings. (The core text in this regard, the opening lines of Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, is stated hypothetically rather than dogmatically, as Montaigne well understood.) And "Stoicism" was hardly a major problem requiring criticism in Montaigne's time. Rather, it is Christianity that clearly ordains a single ultimate good for all human beings -- and it is against the Christian teaching that Montaigne's rejection of the possibility of "transcending" our condition (disguised, for prudential reasons, as a critique of philosophy) is directed. Hence not only did Montaigne anticipate the more open "naturalism" of successors like Hume, as Schneewind recognizes (221); the very meaning of the "morality of self-governance" that he espouses (225) is a renunciation of "foreign," i.e., divine, authority (Essays III.12, 794; cf. Machiavelli, The Prince, chs. 6-7, 24-26).

Taken together, these essays unfortunately signify the decline of the academic study of Montaigne's thought into a scholarly "industry," in which each scholar pursues a part of the whole, without adequate reflection on what the whole means, or why it matters. Equally important, few of those who purport to study Montaigne's "philosophy" give evidence of having studied the writings of his most important philosophic predecessors (including Plato, Aristotle, Xenophon, and Cicero) from whose writings he borrows so extensively, and with whom, in the pages of the Essays, he conducts a philosophic dialogue. As a result, the scholars all-too-readily accept the straw man of exoteric dogmatism against which Montaigne shadow-boxes as representing his own conception of classical philosophy, disregarding his account of how the ancient philosophers concealed their real thought from the public so as not "to frighten the children," or suffer the fate of Socrates (Essays II.12, 408; III.9, 756-7; III.10, 769). In sum, today's scholars fail to appreciate Montaigne's recognition of political philosophy as the very core of philosophy itself.

Even the eight-page "selective critical bibliography" that concludes this book fails to live up to its name: it is not at all critical, but simply a list (without critical commentary) of scholarly books and articles, most of them published during the past three decades, and not all of them even about Montaigne. Most if not all the works listed appear to have been included because they are cited in one or more of the contributions to the volume. Even though the bibliography includes sources in French as well as English, it omits the work of such great twentieth-century Montaignists as Arthur Armaingaud, Fortunat Strowski, and Zbigniew Gierczynski, to say nothing of Charles Sainte-Beuve's classic nineteenth-century essay on Montaigne, Richard Sayce's eminently readable and judicious The Essays of Montaigne: A Critical Exploration (London, 1972), or the provocative interpretations of the present-day scholar Daniel Martin (of the University of Massachusetts). Also unmentioned is Jacob Zeitlin's very useful essay-by-essay commentary in his three-volume translation of the Essays (New York, 1935). In place of works of broad sweep and erudition like those of Armaingaud and Sayce, the reader is directed to a variety of mostly specialized studies, akin to those included in this volume.

Students approaching the Essays for the first time and seeking a trustworthy companion as they embark on that voyage would be better advised to turn to the Sayce volume, which addresses (among other points) the major interpretative issues. Those seeking greater knowledge of Montaigne's life -- which should not, however, be the central focus of a study of the Essays -- will find a good account in Donald Frame's Montaigne: A Biography (New York, 1965).

More advanced readers fluent in French who wish to sample the most important scholarly literature on Montaigne are encouraged to revisit the "great debate" between Villey and Armaingaud over whether the essayist's thought "evolved." While Armaingaud convincingly refuted Villey's claim to have discovered a three-stage evolution in Montaigne's thought (from Stoic to skeptic to Epicurean), the book's overall appearance does roughly conform to that schema, encouraging the suspicion (I have argued elsewhere) that it exemplifies the sort of transformation that Montaigne sought to bring about in the thought of his readers. Armaingaud also offered the greatest challenge to Villey's account of Montaigne's thought (subsequently adopted by most scholars) as conservative or reactionary, indicating by contrast the radical project of political liberalization that Montaigne barely concealed under a mask of protective rhetoric. Francophone readers should also consult the fine series of articles analyzing Montaigne's (anti)religious thought by Gierczynski in the Polish journal Roczniki Humanistyczne (1967-1970).

Those seeking a plausible account of the forbidding first chapter of the Essays could not do better than to consider Robert Eden's essay "The Introduction of Montaigne's Politics," Perspectives in Political Science, (Fall, 1991), pp. 211-220, which exhibits the rewards that can be gained from carefully considering the use Montaigne makes of his sources. Finally, for those interested in a comprehensive examination of the Essays as a work of political philosophy, I venture to mention my own The Political Philosophy of Montaigne (Ithaca and London, 1990). Even if my account is correct, it still leaves many textual puzzles unresolved. The true Montaignist welcomes fellow seekers in "this hunt for knowledge," knowing that "it is only personal weakness that makes us content with what others or we ourselves have found out" (Essays III.13, 817).

Above all, however, the reader is encouraged to approach the Essays with an open and inquiring mind, unburdened with surplus scholarly baggage. It is for such "friends," not for academic specialists, that Montaigne truly intended his book (I.28, 136; I.40, 185-6; III.3, 625; cf. I.25).