The Cambridge Companion to Newton

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Cohen, I. Bernard and Smith, George E., (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Newton, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 500pp, $23.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521656966.

Reviewed by Zvi Biener, University of Pittsburgh and Christopher Smeenk , Dibner Institute, MIT


For over three centuries, Newtonian science has provided the backdrop for discussions of the epistemological and ontological implications of empirical science. Philosophers interested in the impact of Newtonian science on the development of philosophy thus face the daunting task of teasing the historical truth from three centuries of elaborations and myths regarding Newton and his intellectual legacy. The current volume has the explicit dual goal of peeling away a number of prevailing misconceptions and introducing Newtonian science to a philosophical audience. In both regards, it is a success. The Companion is bound to become a standard reference work, and it is indispensable for scholars and newcomers interested in 17th and 18th century natural philosophy. Thus it is unfortunate that the volume’s excellent coverage of some aspects of Newton scholarship does not extend more broadly. There is a clear division between Newton’s scientific work (roughly two thirds of the volume) and the work of the “other Newton” – the natural philosopher, theologian, and alchemist revealed through unpublished manuscripts studied over the last four decades. The Companion gives a clear overview of the aspects of Newton’s work that had the greatest immediate impact on his contemporaries, at the cost of neglecting Newton’s connections with earlier philosophical traditions that are only hinted at in his published works.

As with other volumes in the Cambridge Companion series, the editors commissioned original essays (16 in total) and supplemented these with an introduction and bibliography. The essays regarding the “technical Newton” reap the substantial rewards of a recent resurgence of interest in careful reconstructions of Newtonian science and methodology. Below we will follow one of the volume’s threads- – concerning Newton’s methodology and its philosophical consequences – through the essays of Alan Shapiro, William Harper, George Smith, Howard Stein, and Robert DiSalle. These essays carefully and convincingly demonstrate that Newton’s methodological advances and ontological commitments must be understood in relation to his attempts to address a set of well-defined empirical concerns. However, we would like to stress that Newton’s thinking should not be understood as addressing those concerns exclusively. As some of the remaining, much briefer essays concerning the “other Newton” show, Newton saw himself not only as tackling the technical requirements of framing a new physics, but as responding to traditional philosophical and theological worries. What is missing from the Companion is a clear vision of how these two motivations dovetail with one another, or an argument that there was in fact little interplay between these pursuits. Niccolò Guicciardini’s and Maurizio Mamiani’s essays are of note in this regard, since they suggest how a reconciliation of Newton’s “Janus faces” may be reached.

Newton first declared that his experimental research embodied a new mode of inquiry in his early optical publications (1672-76). Critics such as Hooke rejected Newton’s claims to have established results “without any suspicion of doubts” and argued that Newton’s results depended upon an unacknowledged hypothesis: that light consists of small corpuscles. Newton found this misconstrual of his work so infuriating that he bitterly withdrew from public discussions of natural philosophy for nearly a decade. Shapiro’s masterful overview of Newton’s optical research focuses on these methodological debates. Shapiro argues convincingly in Newton’s favor regarding the early disputes: the central innovation in his theory of color, namely that white light is composed of rays of differing refrangability, does not depend upon the corpuscular hypothesis. Although Newton later used the corpuscular hypothesis to account for dispersion, refraction, and the colors of thin films, Shapiro explains that the hypothesis met with only qualitative successes and several failures. Newton was keenly aware of its limitations, and thus found his critics’ tendency to blur the line between it and results “demonstrated by experiments” particularly galling. Nevertheless, Newton did not always draw such a sharp line between conjectures and certainties. In 1675 he introduced aether vibrations to account for periodic behavior he had carefully observed in his study of “Newton’s rings.” In the Opticks this conjecture was transformed into “fits of easy reflection and refraction” and presented as an established principle (p. 245). But what legitimated this elevation – or the elevated status of other ideas, such as the atomic theory of matter? Shapiro’s essay ultimately raises more questions than it answers regarding the ways in which conjectures receive sufficient warrant to become established principles.

Newton’s contemporaries and subsequent scholars have long attempted to answer these and other questions in light of the Principia and Newton’s various methodological pronouncements. Smith’s contribution draws together a number of insights regarding Newtonian methodology based on an extremely thorough reading of the Principia. This essay and Harper’s line-by-line reconstruction of the argument for universal gravitation both emphasize several contrasts between Newton’s and earlier “hypothetico-deductive” methodology. The Principia introduces a general mathematical theory of forces that has few (if any) direct consequences for observed phenomena without constraints provided by observations. The mathematical apparatus of Books I and II links characteristics of forces to observed features of motion, either in terms of specific parameters or general qualitative features. The theory is not tested by checking directly measurable quantities; instead, observations are used to “deduce” the features of postulated forces, and then the framework generates a variety of consequences of the postulated force law. Smith and Harper both stress that Newton counted agreement between independent measures of a force as significant evidence in favor of the theory. For example, the famous “moon test” in proposition III.4 emphasizes the precise numerical agreement between the moon’s one-second falling distance (measured using orbital parameters) and the same distance for bodies in Paris (measured with Huygens’ seconds pendulum). Harper’s leitmotif is that Newton’s argument for universal gravitation proceeds by showing that independent measures of “causal parameters” for the force of gravity converge on stable values and that this convergence constitutes empirical success.

Several other aspects of the methodology in the Principia are highlighted in Smith’s rich essay, of which we will mention only the interplay between approximation and idealization. Newton clearly stated one of the obstacles to gleaning an understanding of forces from the phenomena of planetary motion: “But to consider simultaneously all these causes of [planetary] motion and to define these motions by exact laws admitting of easy calculation exceeds, if I am not mistaken, the force of any human mind” (quoted on p. 153). Newton responded by carefully ensuring that his arguments from the phenomena hold even in the face of inexactitude. We can illustrate the idea with a simple contrast: if a planet sweeps out nearly equal areas in equal times, the force holding it in orbit is approximately centripetal (as Newton shows in corollaries to proposition I.3); however, a body can move in an approximately elliptical orbit with a force law that is not even approximately inverse square (see Smith 2002). The argument for universal gravitation relies on inferences like the former, whose consequent holds approximately if the antecedent only holds approximately. In addition, Newton clearly recognized the importance of approaching the complexities of real motions via a series of successive approximations. Briefly, Smith argues that at each stage of approximation remaining differences between observations and the “exact theory” point the way towards further refinements. Here Smith draws on Cohen’s earlier work on the “Newtonian Style” but adds considerable sophistication: the successive approximations are not just a matter of ensuring mathematical tractability; they also allow one to bring further evidence to bear on the theory. As Curtis Wilson’s essay shows in detail, Newton’s various proposals in Book III for extending gravitational theory inspired a long process of refinement and reformulation throughout the 18th and 19th centuries that eventually led to satisfactory accounts of lunar motion, the inequalities of Jupiter and Saturn, etc. Smith rightly emphasizes this often unappreciated, progressive aspect of Newton’s methodology: the framework of the Principia provided fruitful ways of using evidence to refine theory well into the 20th century.

To their credit, these essays clearly rebut quick dismissals of the “mad Newtonian methodology” of deduction from the phenomena as a “joke” (to quote Lakatos), dismissals that were prevalent among philosophers of science a generation ago. However, both Harper and Smith tend towards an unabashedly modern reading of Newton’s methodology, drawing on recent work in philosophy of science. Although both essays amply illustrate the fruits of this approach, their utility for historians of philosophy and science are less clear. For example, Harper’s claim that “those qualities of bodies that cannot be intended or remitted [Newton’s criterion in the third rule of philosophizing] are those that count as constant parameter values” (p. 188) throws doubt on the adequacy of Harper’s notion of “parameter value.” Is the quality of “solidity” to be taken as a parameter value? Generally, Harper interprets the Regulæ Philosophandi as “being backed by an ideal of empirical success” as defined by him (p.185), thereby neglecting the literature (such as Maurizio Mamiani’s essay in the present volume) on their conceptual genealogy and the metaphysics that, in Newton’s eyes, backed their usefulness as methodological rules (see also McGuire 1970). The Companion overlooks existing literature on several similar issues. I. B. Cohen’s essay introduces Newton’s concepts of force and mass through a discussion of the definitions and laws of motion at the opening of the Principia. At the end of a brief discussion of vis insita and vis inertia (introduced in Definitions 3 and 4), Cohen remarks that “Newton never explained why he wrote of a vis inertiae, a ‘force of inertia,’ rather than a property of inertia and we have no basis for guessing what was his state of mind” (p. 62). While it is true that from a modern point of view Newton’s language is extremely puzzling, other commentators have argued that it reflects his indebtedness to Aristotelian thought and to the associated ontology that regards vis insita as an internal causal principle that generates inertial motion rather than treating it as an uncaused “state of motion” (see McGuire 1994, McMullin 1978).

Guicciardini’s essay successfully demonstrates how sensitivity to the conceptual milieu of the 17th century can be fruitfully combined with attention to technical detail. By 1671 Newton had developed the methods of fluxional analysis to such a degree that he outstripped all his contemporaries, but rather than publish his work Newton came to doubt the value of the symbolic techniques he had so thoroughly mastered. Guicciardini situates Newton’s developing preference for a “geometrical style” against the backdrop of Newton’s own admiration of ancient knowledge and the broader “geometrical backlash” against algebraic methods represented by Barrow and Hobbes. Newton’s preference for a geometrical style had a remarkable impact on his later work, including the “synthetic account of fluxions” given in the Geometria Curvilinea and, most notably, the mathematical methods used in the Principia. We hope this essay will inspire similar research into Newton’s philosophy of mathematics, a topic that has too often taken a back seat to investigations of Newton’s natural philosophy.

In the Companion’s longest contribution and its centerpiece, Stein develops an account of Newton’s metaphysics rich in philosophical context. Motivated by a careful reading of an unpublished manuscript known as “De Grav,” Stein focuses on Newton’s strikingly original conceptions of space, body, and force and illustrates how Newton’s ontological claims grew out of a need to adequately define the basic concepts of his physics. One of Newton’s main philosophical innovations, as Stein makes admirably clear, was to make metaphysics beholden to the findings of physics, thereby inverting the tree of knowledge as conceived by his contemporaries, notably Descartes. This emphasis on the . posteriori nature of Newton’s reasoning is one of the overarching philosophical morals of the Companion. Stein supports this general thesis by showing how Newton’s concepts of motion, space, and body were defined in relation to the findings of the senses, not a set of . priori principles. Stein stresses that Newton develops an account of body as “moving regions of impenetrability” that is meant to be sufficient to account for experience, while rejecting a Lockean demand for a deeper understanding of the necessity of this account of the constitution of matter. Stein characterizes this fundamental conceptual shift as one away from an emphasis on the substantial unity underlying the various attributes of matter toward a “field” conception: “in creating a body, God (or in the “constitution” of a body, nature) must impose, not only the field of impenetrability and the laws of motion appropriate thereto, but other fields as well, with their laws, characterizing forces of interaction …” (pp. 288-89). The nature of the laws of motion and their relation to matter has been a recurring theme in Newton scholarship, and Stein’s essay is certainly an important contribution to these ongoing debates.

Throughout his essay Stein advocates a reading of Newton’s metaphysics that downplays the relevance of his theological views; he comments that studies linking Newton’s ontology to his theological views are “at variance with at least the epistemological side of Newton’s own metaphysics” (p. 297, f.n. 17, emphasis added). The emanative nature of space as presented in “De Grav” is taken as a case in point (pp. 267-272). According to Stein, Newton urges that space be understood as a logical consequence of the existence of God or any other being, not a causal effect conditional on His essence. Consequently, deliberations regarding the essence of God are unnecessary for understanding the nature of space; as Newton puts it: “we have an absolute Idea of [extension] without any relationship to God” (p.271). Stein is in agreement here with existing literature on the subject. Other commentators have defended a similar claim, namely that space is a transcendental condition for any existent and is thus not dependent on God’s particular essence (see McGuire (1990) and Carriero (1990)). However, from the thesis that according to Newton the content of the idea of space does not depend on the content of the idea of God, Stein draws the conclusion that Newton’s metaphysics of space is independent from his theology. Although the antecedent is unproblematic, the consequent, which is embodied in Stein’s denial of the claim that “the basic conceptions of Newton’s natural philosophy, most especially his conception of space and time, [are] derivative from, or grounded in, this theology” (quote from McGuire on p.297, f.n. 17) does not follow. We would like to stress this point, at the risk of sounding overly critical of Stein’s fine essay, in response to a general inclination of many of the essays in the Companion to emphasize Newton’s scientific acumen while underestimating his concern with traditional philosophical debates regarding method and ontology.

Alan Gabbey’s essay on Newton’s relation to the mechanical philosophy stands out as going against this general trend. Regarding the current topic, Gabbey argues that in “De Grav” Newton rejects the Cartesian conception of res extensa in favor of an emanationist view of space to preclude the possibility of understanding the existence of body without reference to an act of God, as well as to account for the possibility of a coherent mind-body union. Gabbey’s meandering essay describes the disciplinary context of 17th-century natural philosophy, mathematics, and metaphysics and argues that although Newton is primarily a natural philosopher and mathematician, he also addressed metaphysical problems. While it is unclear how Newton himself conceived the relationship of his research to these problems, Gabbey stresses that “there are metaphysical aspects of his natural philosophy that are crucial to an adequate understanding of… his engagement with the mechanical philosophy, and… his account of the causal interventions of mind and soul in the physical world” (p.333). On the first count, Gabbey notes that Newton advocated explanations using non-material agents whose actions did not proceed with the type of “metaphysical necessity” required by the likes of Boyle, Descartes, and Gassendi. On the second, he shows how Newton’s belief that an act of human will can create corporeal motions—possibly violating the 3rd law of motion—colors much of his analysis of space and body. In either case, Gabbey makes amply clear how Newton’s metaphysical views bore directly on his natural philosophy. Likewise, the essays of Carriero and McGuire cited above demonstrate that Newton was concerned with harmonizing his theory of space with traditional theological concerns regarding God’s essence, His causal efficacy, and His being in the world.

DiSalle’s essay on the status of Newton’s “definitions” of space and time complements Stein’s piece by elucidating the way in which these notions were required by Newtonian physics. Reichenbach once characterized Newton’s absolute space and time as a “mystical philosophical superstructure,” to be criticized on the broadly philosophical grounds suggested by Leibniz, Mach and Einstein. DiSalle follows recent work in philosophy of space and time in rejecting this view, and developing in its place an “empiricist” account that emphasizes the empirical content acquired by the ideas of space and time within the framework of Newtonian physics. On this account, Newton’s main concern in the famous scholium following the laws is not a proof of the existence of absolute space, but rather an assessment of the definitions of space and time already implicit in dynamical reasoning about motion and its causes by Newton and his contemporaries. The scholium presents a series of arguments to the effect that various properties of motion cannot be analyzed in terms of relative time and space. (See, in particular, Rynasiewicz 1995 for a careful reading of Newton’s scholium complementary to DiSalle’s essay.) Newton’s main target here, as in the “De Grav,” is Descartes, and his attempt to combine a dynamics attributing a unique state of motion or rest to bodies with a relational account of motion that cannot underwrite such a distinction. As DiSalle explains, in response Newton introduced more structure than his physics actually required: the distinction between accelerated and uniform motion is crucial to identifying forces, but the attribution of forces does not, as Newton thought, differentiate between states of motion with respect to absolute space (pp. 40-42). Newton did not introduce “fictitious forces” that are caused by motion with respect to absolute space; rather, forces and inertial effects define true motions, in the sense of providing empirical criteria for determining a body’s true state of motion within the framework of the Principia. However, we are not convinced that this emphasis on the definitional nature of Newton’s claims regarding space and time will dissolve the “absolute vs. relational” debate entirely, as DiSalle seems to suggest. We should further remark that DiSalle’s vocabulary does not follow Newton’s own: DiSalle often characterizes the Laws as defining “space,” “time,” and even “impressed force” (p. 45), which is at odds with the Principia’s explicit separation between the Laws, Definitions, and consequences of both conjointly. But we are only pointing out a missed opportunity: attention to this point would have aided DiSalle’s overall argument. In any case, DiSalle’s essay is a lucid reconstruction of Newton’s analysis of space and time.

Two of the remaining essays include more technical detail than the rest of the volume, and are probably less suitable for the intended audience of the Companion. Bruce Brackenridge and Michael Nauenberg give a concise account of their recent work regarding Newton’s use of curvature as a measure of force. This essay advocates a major change in the understanding of Newton’s development of the concept of force and the appropriate mathematical tools for studying dynamics. According to Brackenridge and Nauenberg, curvature played a decisive role in generalizing the concept of force beyond the case of uniform circular motion in Newton’s thinking from the mid 60s until the 80s. The curvature measure has been overlooked because the first edition of the Principia relied mainly on a geometrical measure of force, but Brackenridge and Nauenberg trace its use through early dynamical works, Newton’s correspondence with Hooke in 1679-80, and revisions of the Principia. Curtis Wilson’s contribution describes celestial mechanics before and after Newton, emphasizing the treatment of Kepler’s so-called laws prior to the Principia and dispelling the common misconception that the Principia itself fully established the implications of universal gravitation for celestial mechanics.

Unfortunately we do not have space to discuss the shorter essays from the last third of the volume in much detail. William Newman and Karin Figala discuss Newton’s alchemy, emphasizing his indebtedness to a number of contemporaries and the tight connection between his matter theory and alchemical research. Together the essays total only 28 pages, providing a very brief introduction to one of Newton’s major intellectual pursuits. Newman analyzes various texts in which Newton appeals to a Helmontian “shell theory” of matter to explain chemical phenomena. Figala focuses on the influence of the overtly theological work of Sendivogius and the German Rosicrucian Maier on Newton’s alchemical studies. Scott Mandelbrote’s essay recounts the impact of Newton’s unorthodox theological writings on debates among 18th century divines. Newton’s growing authority in other matters did not compel the admiration of the theologians, who seemed to relish the chance to dismantle his arguments in the (posthumously published) Chronology of Ancient Kingdom’s Amended (pp. 414-17). Mamiani recounts Newton’s rules for biblical exegesis as set out in the Treatise on Apocalypse and their relation to dream interpretation. Newton believed that these domains could be understood through a search for correspondences between types of actions or structures, i.e., by analogy. For example, analogy can be found between the chromatic scale and the tonal scale or between the relationship of tension and tones in a string and the law of gravity. These correspondences allow Newton to find within the writings of the prophets indicators of the true structure of the universe, itself a form of God’s “writing”. Mamiani traces the source of Newton’s method for interpreting scripture as well as his Regulae Philosophandi to Sanderson’s Logicae artis compendium and takes the (quite tenuous) similarity between the two sets of rules to indicate that Newton conceived of the study of scripture and nature as falling under a common methodology. The final two essays of the volume consider Newton’s disputes with Leibniz. Hall provides a concise account of how an initially cordial correspondence turned into a full-blown priority dispute regarding the invention of the calculus, partially due to the actions of Fatio de Duillier, Keill, and other intermediaries. In the brief final essay, Domenico Bertoloni-Meli emphasizes two aspects of the context of the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence that are typically neglected: first, Caroline’s role as mediator, and second, the primacy of the theological issues at play in the debate.

On the whole, we recommend the Companion to both scholars and newcomers, even though it presents an image of Newton based on traditional historiography. The Companion’s greatest shortcoming lies in its failure to more directly address the difficulties of integrating Newton’s various intellectual pursuits and of understanding his relationship to intellectual traditions other than those acknowledged in his published works. Nevertheless, the overall quality and originality of the essays in this volume demonstrate that substantial advances can still be made regarding both the “technical” and “other” Newton. It is certain that many further advances will be launched from the ground set by the Companion.


Bricker, Phillip and R. I. G. Hughes (1990). Philosophical perspectives on Newtonian science. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.

Carriero, John (1990). “Newton on Space and Time: Comments on J. E. McGuire”, in Bricker and Hughes (1990), 109–133.

McGuire, J. E. (1970). “Atoms and the ‘Analogy of Nature’: Newton’s Third Rule of Philosophizing”, in Tradition and Innovation: Newton’s Metaphysics of Nature. Boston: Kluwer, 3–58.

McGuire, J. E. (1990). “Predicates of Pure Existence: Newton on God’s Space and Time”, in Bricker and Hughes (1990), 91–108.

McGuire, J. E. (1994). “Natural Motion and its causes: Newton on the Vis insita of bodies”, in Mary L. Gill and James G. Lennox (eds.), Self-motion: from Aristotle to Newton, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 305–329.

McMullin, Ernan (1978). Newton of Matter and Activity. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.

Rynasiewicz, Robert (1995). “By Their Properties, Causes and Effects: Newton’s Scholium on Time, Space, Place, and Motion.” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science 26: 133-153 (part I), 295-321 (part II).

Smith, George E. (2002). “From the Phenomenon of the Ellipse to an Inverse-Square Force: Why Not?”, in D. Malament (ed.), Reading Natural Philosophy: Essays in the History and Philosophy of Science and Mathematics. Chicago: Open Court, 31-70.