The Cambridge Companion to Nozick's Anarchy, State, and Utopia

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Ralf M. Bader and John Meadowcroft (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Nozick's Anarchy, State, and Utopia, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 332pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521120029.

Reviewed by Matt Zwolinski, University of San Diego


Robert Nozick's Anarchy, State, and Utopia is widely regarded as one of the most influential books of political philosophy of the 20th century. It is certainly the most influential book oflibertarian political philosophy, at least within the academy. And yet, for all that, Nozick's masterpiece has played a rather curiously limited role in academic political philosophy since its publication almost 40 years ago. It has, for instance, produced almost no Nozickians. It hasn't even really produced very many people who consider themselves to be working in a broadly Nozickian tradition. The one notable exception to this generalization merely heaps irony upon neglect: left-libertarians like Hillel Steiner and Peter Vallentyne follow closely in the neo-Lockean tradition revitalized by Nozick and frequently refer to his work, but all in the service of a politics that is largely opposed to the kind of free market society championed by Nozick. When one compares its reputation with its actual effects, one might just conclude that Anarchy, State, and Utopia is the most uninfluential influential book ever written.

It is also a book that virtually cries out for a companion. One cannot read too far in it without coming across an idea that is brilliant, fecund, intriguing . . . and dropped almost as soon as it is introduced. Whole books, if not whole academic careers, could be devoted to working out in detail the ideas that Nozick relegates to mere footnotes and asides.[1] There is thus an important place for a book like the one that Ralf Bader and John Meadowcroft have put together. Their Cambridge Companion consists of eleven original essays written by a nearly ideal group of contributors - Richard Arneson, Michael Otsuka, Fred Feldman, Eric Mack, Gerald Gaus, Peter Vallentyne, David Schmidtz, Barbara Fried, Chandran Kukathas, and Bader and Meadowcroft themselves -- along with an introductory essay jointly written by the editors. The essays are a good mix of critique and appreciation. And most of them are quite helpful in setting context and defining terms, making the collection as a whole appropriate even for undergraduates with little prior exposure to philosophy. At the same time, almost all the essays engage in at least some level of novel and thought-provoking argument, so that even academics who have tread in these waters many times before will come away with fresh ideas and a fresh appreciation of the subject.

The Cambridge Companion is divided into four parts, the first of which deals almost entirely with chapter three of Anarchy State and Utopia (hereafter ASU), in which Nozick sets out the moral foundations of his position. The second part deals with Nozick's case against the anarchist, the third his libertarian theory of justice and his critique of Rawls in Part II, and the fourth his theory of utopia in Part III. There is substantial overlap between these essays, and because the disagreements (and convergences) among the authors are instructive, the remainder of this review will be organized around ideas rather than around individual essays. The five ideas on which it will focus are: side constraints, the case against anarchism, the experience machine, property rights, and the framework for utopia.

Side Constraints

In the third chapter of ASU, Nozick argues that utilitarianism fails to respect the separateness of persons. A moral theory that did take separateness sufficiently seriously would, Nozick thinks, hold that there are some things that one cannot do to others regardless of the benefit that might thereby be produced. It would hold that individuals have rights that function as side constraints and not merely as moral goals to be maximized in some kind of aggregate. Moreover, Nozick thinks that respect for the separateness of persons requires not merely that rights have the form of side constraints, but that they have a particular content as well: a distinctively libertarian content that prohibits the initiation of aggression against innocent persons.

Richard Arneson (in "Side Constraints, Lockean Individual Rights, and the Moral Basis of Libertarianism") and Michael Otsuka (in "Are Deontological Constraints Irrational?") both make an evaluation of this argument a central focus of their essays. And both find it wanting, for two main reasons. First, it is not at all obvious why the fact that human beings are physically and psychologically separate ought to have any significant moral implications. As Otsuka notes, deer lead separate lives too (49). But Nozick doesn't think this entitles them to the protection of side constraints. Something else must be doing the real work. Otsuka looks to Nozick's appeals to the meaningfulness of life (49) and his gestures at the kind of moral status argument later developed in much greater detail by Thomas Nagel and Frances Kamm (51); Arneson suspects that self-ownership is the true root idea (23). And something in this area seems to be a necessary and correct move. It is not just that we are separate persons that matters; it is that we are separate persons. But spelling out why that matters requires a good deal of deep moral theorizing, theorizing about which even philosophers who recognize the significance of the separateness of persons are likely to disagree. And that, I suppose, is part of why Nozick and Rawls wind up with such very different political theories, despite their common commitment to taking separateness seriously.

But even if we agree that separateness matters, we are still a long way from establishing that taking it seriously requires a side constraint view of morality, let alone a libertarian side constraint view. On this point, there seems to be widespread agreement among the contributors to the volume, even among those like Schmidtz and Meadowcroft who are generally more sympathetic to Nozick's position. As Peter Vallentyne notes in his essay on "Nozick's Libertarian Theory of Justice," even if Nozick's appeal to separateness provides a strong negative argument against classical utilitarianism, it is astonishingly weak as a positive argument for the (very strong) conclusion he wants to draw -- not just libertarian rights, but absolute libertarian rights. Arneson notes that such rights have a variety of implausible implications, such as that individuals have no right to assistance in easy-rescue cases and that compelling rescue in such cases would always be wrong (25-26). He goes on to point out that even if the separateness of our existences is an important fact about human beings, so too are the ways in which our existences are "frequently intertwined" (24). For Arneson, a hybrid view that combined a theory of (non-absolute) side constraints with a teleological theory of moral goals would do a better job of reflecting both of these aspects of our human nature, and at avoiding the unpalatable consequences of the Nozickian view.

The Case Against Anarchism

Part I of ASU argues that individuals in the state of nature would form voluntary protective agencies to ensure the effective defense of their rights. Because of economies of scale and network effects, Nozick argues that one of these agencies would eventually achieve a dominant position. Once this occurs, Nozick believes that the dominant agency would have the right to suppress the activities of independent protection agencies, because and to the extent that those activities subject the clients of the dominant agency to unacceptable risks of rights-violation. This prohibition will be justified so long as the dominant agency compensates the parties who are disadvantaged by it by providing them with free or discounted rights-protection, subsidized by the paying clients of the dominant firm. Once all this has happened, we will be left with a single firm holding a monopoly on rights-enforcement and providing protection to all individuals within its jurisdiction. This is the minimal state, and it will have arisen not through any top-down design nor through a social contract involving tacit or express consent, but by a kind of "invisible hand" process akin to that by which a language, a commodity money, or a equilibrium market price might emerge.

Nozick's argument in this part of the book has been subjected to heavy criticism over the years. One famous line of criticism holds that the hypothetical nature of the invisible hand justification given there renders the entire project nugatory, especially for someone, like Nozick, attracted to a historical theory of justice. Against this, Gerald Gaus argues (in his fascinating essay on "Explanation, Justification, and Emergent Properties") that Nozick's argument is, in fact, "a major advance in political theory" (138). Nozick's argument is best understood, Gaus thinks, as an exercise in the now-neglected realm of explanatory, rather than normative, political theory. If Nozick's argument were successful, it would perform a valuable explanatory service by showing how a state could emerge without design, without consent, out of the prosaic actions of reasonable and rational individuals (138). Through a series of filtering and equilibrium processes, the ordinary actions of individuals give rise to the state as a kind of emergent property. Like emergent properties in general, we are able to make some general predictions about the overall character and behavior of the state, but this macro-predictability is combined with micro-unpredictability -- we do not know, e.g., which agency will become dominant, or what precise form and distributive effects its activities will have (124). Moreover, this explanation is normatively relevant, for it shows, at a minimum, that states are not necessarily rights-violating, and perhaps more strongly that moral legitimacy is a property of minimal states in general. Even the former, weaker conclusion, however, is enough to rebut the anarchist who was Nozick's target in this part of the book.

Of course, all this is premised on the hypothetical (about which Gaus remains pointedly silent) that Nozick's invisible hand argument is actually successful. And there are good reasons to think that it is not. One particular bone of contention for the libertarian anarchists against whom Nozick's argument is directed is the so-called "Principle of Compensation," which holds that persons can be forbidden from performing an action that only might harm others so long as they are compensated for the disadvantages they suffer as a result (ASU, pp. 82-83). This principle sets in motion what Eric Mack (in his wonderful "Nozickian Arguments for the More-Than-Minimal State") refers to as an "attenuation of rights" (100), in which Nozick

moves from a conception of rights as being at their core claims that are protected by property rules (that forbid boundary-crossings) to a conception of rights as being at their core claims that are protected by liability rules (that allow crossings as long as liability for due compensation is paid) (108).

As Barbara Fried notes (in her "Does Nozick Have a Theory of Property Rights?"), this is an odd position for a libertarian to hold, especially one who began his book by proclaiming boldly that "Individuals have rights, and there are things no person or group may do to them (without violating their rights)" (ASUix). An especially intriguing aspect of Mack's essay is his attempt to provide Nozick with a superior response to the anarchist, one which avoids the problem of the attenuation of rights and also provides a libertarian argument for the legitimacy of taxation in a (fairly) minimal state.

The Experience Machine

Nozick devotes just four paragraphs of ASU to his discussion of the "experience machine" (ASU, pp. 42-45), and then only (in characteristic Nozickian form) presents it as what Fred Feldman describes as "a digression within a digression within a digression" (63). But those four have gone on to become perhaps the most discussed and most reprinted paragraphs in the book. And so it is fitting that at least one essay in this collection (Feldman's "What Can We Learn From the Experience Machine") be devoted entirely to an examination of it.

Feldman finds the experience machine to be a "wonderfully provocative thought experiment" (79), but one that ultimately fails to score any real argumentative points against any of its possible targets -- utilitarianism, ethical hedonism, and psychological hedonism. Feldman's dissection and critique of the various possible arguments here is instructive. But sometimes the great variety of arguments he surveys leads him to move perhaps too quickly, as when he discusses one possible anti-utilitarian argument as "unworthy of extended discussion." That argument, briefly, is that act utilitarianism entails that we should plug into the experience machine, even though we clearly should not, and so therefore act utilitarianism must be false. Feldman's critique of this argument consists in claiming that it is "unlikely that a person floating his life away in a tank would be doing much . . . to provide utility for others," and that therefore act utilitarianism would almost certainly recommend not plugging in (66). But this seems to me to neglect the possibility that the experience machine might be extremely good at creating intense and continuous pleasure for those who use it. Now, most of us think that even a tremendous amount of mere pleasure wouldn't justify committing ourselves to waste away our lives in a tank. But classical utilitarianism seems to imply that it would. And this seems to reflect a defect both in the axiology of that theory, and in the fact that, under the right (utility-monster-like) circumstances, it licenses unjustifiably selfish behavior.

Apart from Feldman's essay, the experience machine does not receive much attention elsewhere in the book, except for in a fascinating section of David Schmidtz's essay, "The Right to Distribute." There, Schmidtz recalls one of the reasons Nozick suggests for not plugging in: "We want to do things, not just experience them" (201). What makes life meaningful to us, and hence part of what is morally significant about us as separate persons, is what we do. A benefit that one receives as compensation for meaningful and challenging actions means something different, and more, than a benefit one receives as manna from heaven. But Rawls' original position is set up in a way (a theme of John Meadowcroft's essay, too) that requires us to ignore this aspect of our personhood. According to Schmidtz, it

treats people as if the important thing about them is what they would experience; that is, the bundle of primary goods they take away from the table. What agents bring to the table --what they can do in the future and what they have so far -- is deemed arbitrary from a moral point of view (201).

Such a model of humanity, Schmidtz suggests, would be appropriate for people living inside the experience machine. But not for us.

Property Rights

As one might expect, Nozick's theory of property rights is the subject about which there is probably the greatest contention among the contributors to this volume. Ultimately, though, all the authors endorse a notion of property rights that is far less absolute in one way or another than that proposed by Nozick. Otsuka and Vallentyne, as left-libertarians, largely leave Nozick's endorsement of self-ownership unchallenged, but both are much more critical of his claims regarding ownership of external objects. Vallentyne, in particular, does a thoughtful and thorough job in locating Nozick's position in conceptual space, and showing the many points where he assumes one extreme position in that space without arguing against (or, apparently, even recognizing the possibility of) nearby others. In the context of his discussion of original appropriation, for instance, Nozick fails to explain why labor mixing should not entitle individuals only to the added value their labor produces, rather than to the entire product (160). Such a principle would seem to undermine individuals' claims to ownership of the land as such, thus leading toward a system more akin to that advocated in the early twentieth century by Henry George, and by so-called "geo-libertarians" today.

Barbara Fried is even more critical of Nozick's theory of property rights, arguing, essentially, that he doesn't actually have one. At least, not one that he applies consistently throughout ASUas a whole. At times, Fried writes, Nozick argues like a Lockean Libertarian. But at other points his theory of property rights seems to vacillate between "anything goes" and some kind of utilitarianism (252-253). The underlying problem, according to Fried, is the indeterminacy of basic libertarian principles. Those principles can give plausible and determinate answers if we limit our inquiry to questions like whether compulsory eyeball transplants should be performed for the benefit of the blind. But beyond these simple cases, Fried thinks, the Nozickian project is "hopeless" -- an "analytic train wreck" (236). She elaborates:

In Nozick's optimistic view, once we exclude the clear cases where I have an unfettered right to do X and the equally clear cases where I have no right to do X, almost no details remain to be filled in . . . But in reality almost everything remains to be filled in. The details fill volumes and volumes of civil-law statutes and court decisions in contracts, torts, real property, intellectual property, trusts and estates, civil procedure, corporations, debtor/creditor law, environmental law - the list goes on and on. (249)

The problem isn't just Nozick's. Any deontological theory faces similar problems, on Fried's view. But it is not clear that Fried has actually given us reason to reject deontology in favor of utilitarianism. There is a difference between saying that the evaluation of consequences plays an important role in morality, and saying (as the utilitarian does) that consequences are the onlything that matter. Fried seems to see Nozick's occasional appeal to consequences and context as a betrayal of libertarian principles. But it's hard to find a contemporary or historical example of libertarian thought in which consequences don't matter in some important way, even in the natural rights tradition. The standard of libertarian purity against which Fried judges Nozick to have failed seems to be largely a product of her own construction.

The Framework for Utopia

In Part III of ASU, Nozick provides what he believes to be an argument for the minimal state that is independent of the arguments set out in Parts I and II. However, as Ralf Bader notes in his careful and extremely helpful essay, "The Framework for Utopia," it is not entirely clear just what that independent argument is supposed to be. The general idea is that the minimal state is supposed to serve not as a utopian society itself -- for there are too many people with too many diverse preferences for a single society to be best for everyone. Rather, the minimal state is a kind of framework in which individuals can find their own utopias by creating and joining voluntary associations with other individuals.

One way this might constitute an argument for the minimal state is if the minimal state were held to be the best means for allowing each person to live in a utopia of his or her own. The minimal state rules out rights-violating coercion, so individuals cannot be forced to live in a society in which they do not want to remain. And if they do not like the societies on offer, they are free to start their own. In this way, Nozick's libertarian framework can accommodate socialistic sub-communities, but the reverse is not true.

But while Bader concedes that considerations like this might provide some support to the case Nozick made for the minimal state in Parts I and II, it cannot provide a successful independent argument. For, after all, there are things besides coercion that prevent people from leaving communities they dislike and creating or joining others that they prefer -- things like transaction costs, coordination problems, and faulty beliefs (280). A more-than-minimal state might try to reduce these other sources of "friction" as well, and thus conceivably do a better job at allowing individuals to realize utopia. If Nozick's argument is instrumental in nature, careful empirical and theoretical work would be required to demonstrate that the minimal state is the besttool for the job. There are, of course, other ways of construing Nozick's argument, and Bader surveys these as well. But they are, on his view, no more successful as independent arguments for the minimal state this one.

Chandran Kukathas (in his "E Pluribus Plurum, or, How to Fail to Get to Utopia in Spite of Really Trying") agrees that Nozick's argument fails to justify the minimal state, but argues that what is really needed is a less than minimal state, i.e., no state at all. The kind of framework that Nozick envisions the minimal state providing can be provided by the filtering and equilibrium processes of the state of nature. And, ultimately, the aim of the state -- even a minimal one -- is one that is directly contrary to the goal of diverse utopias, for the state's goal is precisely to suppress rather than enable the pursuit of diverse ideals (290).

* * * * * * * *

There is, of course, more to ASU, and more to this companion, than the five ideas on which I have focused in this review. But the discussion here is suggestive of some general conclusions about the significance of Nozick's work. One important conclusion is this: almost all of the central arguments that Nozick sets out in ASU in defense of the minimal state are generally regarded as (at best) less than fully successful, even by philosophers who are sympathetic to his libertarian position.

But just as ASU was not the first word on libertarianism (Nozick drew much of his inspiration from conversations with Murray Rothbard), it is also not (and was not intended to be) the last word (ASUxii). It is not even the last word on Nozickian libertarianism. Despite his seeming rejection of libertarianism in The Examined Life, Nozick stressed in his last published interview (accessed 9/28/12) that he never stopped identifying himself as a libertarian. And in his last book, Invariances, he defended a libertarian principle of voluntary cooperation as "the core principle of ethics." True, he does not defend that principle on grounds of self-ownership (though perhaps he never did in ASU, either -- the word appears only once in its 353 pages and seems largely to be a product of G.A. Cohen's influential criticism of Nozick). Instead Nozick, and contemporary libertarians too, seem more concerned with considerations of mutual benefit and peaceful cooperation.

Libertarian thought has thus largely moved on from ASU, in terms of both the character of its arguments and the contours of its conclusions. But to admit this is hardly to denigrate the achievement, beauty, and fun of the book. As the editors of the Cambridge Companion write, and as the essays in their volume attest, ASU is a rich source of "insightful suggestions, ideas, and arguments, as well as a range of powerful criticisms of alternative views" (11). It was the fountainhead of a research program that has been, and continues to be, enormously fruitful.

[1] In his contribution to this volume, Michael Otsuka recounts the following illustrative story from Frances Kamm:

[When I was a graduate student] I took an ethics course with Bob Nozick at Harvard – and that’s what did it, because I found what he was doing really interesting. You know, about one-and-a-half years before he died, Nozick gave a talk in my ethics colloquium at NYU, where I was teaching at the time. And when I introduced him, I said that for the last twenty years I had been finishing the term paper for his class. (57)