The Cambridge Companion to Peirce

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Cheryl Misak (ed), The Cambridge Companion to Peirce, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 376pp, $25.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521579104.

Reviewed by C. F. Delaney, University of Notre Dame


Historical studies of particular philosophers fall into several distinct although not sharply delineated categories that I will order according to increasing 'philosophical' involvement. First, there are those that are purely historical/interpretative where the primary point is to sort out an elusive issue of textual interpretation so as to get inside the mind of the author to determine what he/she actually claimed and why. Secondly, there are efforts to grapple philosophically with the historical figure to discern what he/she was actually committed to given the issues at stake and other views clearly held. This usually involves the regimentation of some recalcitrant texts and the interpretative elaboration of others. Thirdly, there are creative philosophic efforts to get inside the problematic of the text so as to think through the problem anew guided along the way by the specific suggestions in the text. Here the guiding force is the philosophical problem rather than the specifics of the text.

The great majority of papers in this excellent collection are in the second category; since only a few can be seen as falling in the first and third categories, I will comment on these first. In the first category Boler's paper on 'Peirce and Medieval Thought' is a cautious effort to trace the influence of medieval figures on Peirce's thought. Drawing on textual references, a reconstruction of the items in Peirce's own library, and the similarities of Peirce's views with those of specific medieval thinkers, Boler focuses on Duns Scotus' influence on Peirce's scholastic realism while being careful to take into account the different philosophical worlds in which each lives. Particularly helpful are his cautionary notes about the quite different valences of "realism" as we move from the medieval period to the modern. Anderson's 'Peirce's Common Sense Marriage of Religion and Science' is similarly historical. After an initial contrast with the philosophies of religion of both James and Royce, Anderson shows how Peirce developed a philosophy of religion that while inimical to theology was not inimical to the notion of a church. In so doing he makes the points that Peirce's view combines a defense of religious experience with the concept of a universal church and that such a view is continuous with rather than hostile to the domain of science.

At the other end of the spectrum, David Wiggins' paper 'Reflections on Inquiry and Truth' could be seen as falling into my third category of historical study. Wiggins takes as his starting point the fact that Peirce himself rethought and rewrote his pivotal paper 'The Fixation of Belief' several times, and Wiggins proposes as his methodological principle the following:

If Peirce's ideas are to reach again into the bloodstream of philosophy, then we need not only fresh studies of his texts but speculative transpositions of these ideas -- transpositions recognized as speculative but given in language that can be understood without any reference to special or peculiar stipulations. (89)

This principle licenses his frequently saying such things as "all that X needs to mean (I suggest) is …" (94), "one wishes he had not said what he says …"(98), "this is the kind of statement that has given pragmatism a bad name …"(110) or after one of his reformulations "such formulations might not have pleased Peirce but they hold a place for a view to which he could lay claim if he wanted" (114), and his invoking examples that "Peirce would not have approved …"(107). This methodological principle also licenses his disregarding some central themes in the classic paper with the caveat that this is "another Peircean preoccupation we shall abandon …"(89). Some 'Peirce-purists' might cringe at this mode of interpretation but in this case we have one great philosopher rethinking a classic paper of another, and Wiggins' rethinking rewards careful reading. Wiggins like Peirce is interested in the connection between one's theory of inquiry and one's conception of truth, and, reflecting on Dummett's antirealism and Hume's classic challenge to induction, proposes as a 'speculative reconstruction' of Peirce's fourth method of fixing belief a 'semantic operationalism' that is a philosophically plausible theory of truth. The other paper in this category is Peter Skagestad's 'Peirce's Semiotic Model of Mind'. After commenting on what it would be for a theory of mind to be a semiotic theory, Skagestad relates Peirce's model of mind to a whole host of contemporary theories ranging from Wittgenstein and Popper to computational models and artificial intelligence.

The other papers in the collection fall in my second category of historical studies, i.e., philosophically critical interpretations of historical positions. Christopher Hookway's papers are always a model of this mode of interpretation, and his 'Truth, Reality and Convergence' is no exception. In it he is concerned to explore the issues involved in Putnam's charge that Peirce's convergence account of truth commits him to what Bernard Williams has characterized as the absolute conception of reality. Hookway argues that while this tight tie between truth and reality appears to be supported by the early writings of Peirce (before 1880) it is not supported by the later writings; moreover a weaker interpretation of the tie called for by the later writings, certain distinctions being made, is compatible with the earlier texts. Accordingly, Peirce is not guilty as charged. Cheryl Misak's 'Peirce on Vital Matters' is in the same reconstructive spirit. Explicit texts of Peirce seem to call for a sharp distinction between decision making in science, which has to do with truth in the long run, and in ethics, which has to do with appropriateness in the here and now. Scientific method is required for the former, instinct and convention for the latter. This would imply that science is a cognitive matter whereas ethics is non-cognitive. Misak takes issue with this simple dichotomy by exploring the roles of instinct and experience in both science and ethics. She makes an interesting case for overcoming the stark texts, but a distinction needs to be made between ethical theorizing and ethical decision-making. Ethical theorizing may be a matter for scientific inquiry while concrete ethical decision making (vital matters) might be appropriately non-cognitive, the former having to do with the long run and the latter with the here and now. It is this latter difference (long run vs. here and now) that drives Peirce's dichotomy in the first place. Sami Pihlstrom's 'Peirce's Place in the Pragmatist Tradition' explores in considerable detail Peirce's multifaceted reflections on James' version of pragmatism and in less detail his relation to the classical pragmatisms of Dewey and Schiller and to the various neopragmatistisms on the current scene. His concluding section makes the case that the 'realism vs. idealism' issue is pivotal in sorting the various forms of pragmatism. Sandra Rosenthal's 'Peirce's Pragmatic Account of Perception: Issues and Implications' tackles one of the most convoluted dimensions of Peirce's philosophy, namely, his fine-grained account of the components of perceptual awareness. This is as complicated as it is important. Perception is crucial to his account of abduction and confirmation in science and to his more general stance along the 'realism'-'idealism'-'phenomenalism' spectrum. Peirce mobilizes subtle distinctions between the perceptual judgment, the percept and the percipuum to respond to these various problematics simultaneously.

The other three papers in the volume are also in this second interpretative category and deal with his semiotic and logic. T.L. Short's 'The Development of Peirce's Theory of Signs' traces the corrections Peirce made to his theory of signs from its initial introduction in the 1866-9 period to the mature post-1906 view together with the reasons for the corrections. He argues convincingly against the claim that Peirce never seriously modified his early view of thought-signs and for the view that the specific late modifications in terms of the final interpretant and the dynamical object were crucial to his realism. Isaak Levi's 'Beware of Syllogism: Statistical Reasoning and Conjecturing According to Peirce' explores the details of Peirce's growing awareness that his attachment to the syllogistic form impeded his ability to grasp the true structure of developments in scientific reasoning. In particular, Levi argues that Peirce's constant attempts to use permutations of the syllogism to classify ampliative inferences into abduction and induction were more misleading than illuminating, and that he came to see that it was far more helpful to think of these 'kinds of inference' in terms of their different roles in scientific inquiry in general. This reorientation in terms of the aims of these kinds of reasoning enabled Peirce to see the centrality of normativity and context to logic. Finally, Randall Dipert's 'Peirce's Deductive Logic: Its Development, Influence and Philosophical Significance' identifies and assesses Peirce's role in the history of logic. Peirce always thought of himself primarily as a logician; Dipert agrees with and documents this self-assessment as he explicates Peirce's development from Boole's algebraic logic through the logic of relatives to his existential graphs.

Almost all the papers in this fine collection will reward careful reading and clearly 'comprehensiveness' is not a reasonable demand to put on such a collection. Nevertheless, there does seem to be at least one obvious lacuna, which could have been easily addressed. In most general terms Peirce clearly thought of himself as rethinking the Kantian project of exploring the conditions of possibility of science, and in virtue of this has played an important role in contemporary German philosophy. The work of J├╝rgen Habermas and Karl-Otto Apel are primary cases in point, and through them other young German philosophers have become interested in Peirce's version of pragmatism. It would have been good if something that provided a window into this problematic had been included