The Cambridge Companion to Philosophical Methodology

Placeholder book cover

Giuseppina D'Oro and Søren Overgaard (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Philosophical Methodology, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 466pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107547360.




Reviewed by Mario De Caro, Università Roma Tre/Tufts University


In his influential The Philosophy of Philosophy, Timothy Williamson wrote: "Contemporary philosophy lacks a self-image that does it justice." The reason offered for this claim was convincing: all the proposed self-images are "false when bold, uninformative when cautious" (ix). However, realizing that we lack a satisfying self-image of philosophy (i.e., a good metaphilosophy) gives us an excellent motivation to try harder; unsurprisingly, then, in recent years, metaphilosophy has become very popular. Giuseppina D'Oro and Søren Overgaard's book is an important new contribution.

As the editors make clear in their introduction, philosophical methodology is a branch of metaphilosophy, but one that cannot be surgically separated from the other branches, such as investigations on the nature and value of philosophy. In fact, in talking about the methods of philosophy, one cannot entirely avoid the issues of what philosophy is and what it should aim at. Accordingly, most essays in this collection, even if centered on methodological questions, also deal with issues such as the nature, object, value, and purpose of philosophy.

A terminological remark: D'Oro and Overgaard state that the term "philosophy of philosophy" is more felicitous than the more common term "metaphilosophy" (5). In this, they follow Williamson's claim that "metaphilosophy sounds as though it might try to look down on philosophy from above, or beyond" (ibid.). It seems to me, however, that metaphilosophy looks down on philosophy in the same way that a metalanguage looks down on its language -- not very much, indeed. Consequently, I will keep using the term "metaphilosophy" -- as do several contributors to the collection.

D'Oro and Overgaard's introduction notes that one can approach philosophical methodology either descriptively or normatively: the former approach consists in addressing the methods that "philosophers actually use (or advocate), or have used (or advocated)"; the latter consists in defining "how philosophy ought to be done" (4-5). The volume, they say, specifically addresses normative methodology. This is certainly true for the chapters individually: each presents, and in most cases defends, a specific methodological view. As a whole, however, the book can also be taken as an excellent description of how philosophic methodology is conceived and carried out today by different traditions and schools. I will look at the individual papers, although I will not be able to go in the same amount of detail for all of them.

The first part, "Visions of Philosophy," concerns the raison d'être of philosophy. In "Doing Philosophy," Alessandra Tanesini defends the view of philosophy as a craft regarding the art of living, rather than as a systematic set of doctrines. A very different view is offered in "Philosophy as Rational Systematization" by Nicholas Rescher, who argues in favor of a systematic view of philosophy, since "in the end the range of our philosophical concern is a network where everything is systematically interconnected with everything else" (43).

In "Sense-making from A Human Point of View," Adrian Moore develops the idea -- originally presented by Bernard Williams --that philosophy is a humanistic discipline, in the sense that "philosophy, though it is not anthropological, is anthropocentric, [i.e.,] is an attempt, by humans, from their unique position in the world, to make sense both of themselves and of that position" (44-45). According to Moore, it is not that philosophy makes sense of us and of our position in the world by merely accounting for something already out there; rather, it does that by creating concepts, in particular concepts regarding how we should live (Kant's "kingdom of ends" or Nietzsche's "eternal return" are examples). Then Moore articulates what he calls an "artistic conception." According to this, even if there are cases in which philosophy can correctly make use of naturalistic methods, philosophers should avoid a scientistic attitude, since "there can be no presumption that procedures suited to the natural sciences will in general serve philosophy well". Perhaps more surprisingly, Moore warns philosophers to avoid Wittgenstein's conservativism regarding sense-making (Wittgenstein famously claimed that "philosophy leaves everything as it is"),[1] since philosophical sense-making constantly changes, sometimes dramatically.

This view is expounded with great clarity, but some philosophers, of various methodological orientations, may raise an objection: aren't there problems in philosophy where we should just forget about our own unique position in the world? Metaphysical problems such as the possibility of uncaused events, the nature of impossibilia or the possibility of a perfect being, for example? Or logical problems such as the feasibility of a logic that includes local contradictions or the right interpretation of Gödel's incompleteness theorems? If so, why should we say that philosophy is necessarily anthropocentric?

Herman Cappelen's "Disagreement in Philosophy: An Optimistic Perspective" partially differs from the other papers in this section in that it does not endorse a specific methodological view, but addresses a substantial question that has often bothered philosophers: why is there is so much seemingly insurmountable disagreement in philosophy? According to Cappelen, widespread disagreement does not necessarily undermine collective knowledge.  Moreover, one should not think of collective knowledge in philosophy as a value in itself (as do those who complain about philosophical disagreement). Finally, Cappelen claims that the lack-of-consensus objection can also be raised against disciplines whose intellectual credibility is not challenged very often, such as economics. This is convincing: for example, the endless disputes between neo-Keynesians and monetarists about the foundations of macroeconomics certainly do not seem more conducive to general consensus than the discussions between, say, compatibilists and libertarians regarding free will.

The second part, "Conceptual Analysis and the Naturalistic Challenge", includes papers that address the methodological debate between the advocates of conceptual analysis -- traditionally the dominant method in analytic philosophy -- and more naturalistically oriented philosophers.

In "A Naturalistic Methodology" Hilary Kornblith defends the prospects of a naturalized philosophical method. Such a method does undeniably apply to vast parts of philosophy of science: no philosophers could sensibly write about, say, quantum mechanics or natural selection without knowing what contemporary science tells us about those fields. However, Kornblith also discusses in detail some less obvious case studies (regarding, in particular, deliberation and memory),in which a naturalized philosophical methodology seems to recommend itself. Such examples show the falsity of the old-fashioned methodological view (we could call it "methodological isolationism"), according to which philosophy necessarily works a priori, in absolute independence from the empirical work of the sciences. An interesting point that Kornblith raises against methodological isolationism (one that is ignored too often) is that armchair theorizing need not be entirely a priori: "when we sit down in the armchair in order to engage in philosophical contemplation, all our prior beliefs, whatever their source [including experience], may influence our theorizing" (157). Very importantly, this may also be true of intuitions, to which armchair philosophers are partial. Saul Kripke, for example, famously wrote that "something having intuitive content [is] very heavy evidence in favor on it" -- and actually the most "conclusive evidence one can have in favor of anything."[2] Therefore, one can safely conclude that, in many cases, armchair philosophy is not done entirely a priori, and that all the methodological views that advocate plain methodological isolationism are just wrong. Arguably, however, not many contemporary philosophers -- especially in the Anglophone tradition -- would defend methodological isolationism: most of them would grant that, in some respects, when one deals with, say, free will, causation, responsibility, or rationality, one should also consider what science has to say about those phenomena.

The big question, then, is whether the naturalized method should be adopted in all cases.  Quine and the Churchlands have enthusiastically argued that philosophy is continuous with science. Similarly,the arch-naturalist Alex Rosenberg recently wrote: "The tools we should use in answering philosophical problems are the methods and findings of the mature sciences -- from physics across to biology and increasingly neuroscience."[3] Kornblith, however, is ambivalent. In some cases, he is in line with the naturalists: "The methodology of philosophy must involve input from the sciences if it is to engage properly with its subject matter" (159; my italics). In other cases, his defense of methodological naturalism appears more prudent: "We cannot so easily tell, in advance, where untutored views are likely to be overthrown or where further empirical work may lead to a radical revision in our understanding of some phenomenon" (158). The latter claim is compatible with the possibility that some philosophical beliefs are independent from science and can correctly be justified a priori (even if we cannot ultimately determine which beliefs have such status). Trying to resolve this conceptual tension, Kornblith writes: "Without some empirical check on [armchair] theorizing, armchair results should be viewed at best, as only tentative." However, tentativeness is a property of the vast majority of our beliefs, including most (if not all) scientific ones. Does Kornblith hold the view that non-empirically grounded philosophical beliefs are so much more tentative than scientific beliefs -- including those regarding poorly explored territories -- that they cannot ever be taken seriously, unless they get the necessary empirical grounding? If so, the relevant metric of tentativeness should be discussed and justified.

Amie Thomasson's "What Can We Do, When We Do Metaphysics" is an essay in metametaphysics. Traditional "heavyweight" metaphysics, she argues, aims at discovering the deepest facts about the world, those that science cannot reach. This ambitious approach, however, faces three formidable problems: (i) its epistemology is unclear (how exactly can metaphysicians get to know these deepest facts and how reliable are metaphysical intuitions?); (ii) metaphysics is at risk of being progressively dethroned by science; (iii) the constant and irreconcilable disagreements among metaphysicians suggest that this discipline may never discover the alleged deepest facts it aims at (think of the discussions regarding how to conceive of possible worlds, the existence of free will, or the nature of time).

Because of such objections, metaphysical deflationism has recently become increasingly common -- as several of the volume's essays illustrate. Typically, deflationists think that metaphysics is a merely descriptive enterprise that does not discover deep facts, and that the only method should be conceptual analysis. In this way, however, metaphysics risks losing much of its interest. Thomasson, then, proposes a third way: a broader deflationist and conceptualist model with a normative character that, in her view, is able to avoid both the traditional objections to heavyweight metaphysics and the risk of irrelevance that afflicts traditional deflationism. Metaphysics, in her view, does specifically contribute to knowledge, but its contribution should not be understood as meta-ontological realists do (these are the philosophers who think of normative facts in realist terms). Rather, its contribution concerns the pragmatic issue of how to use metaphysically laden terms. The discussions relative to this issue, far from being merely verbal, are philosophically very relevant, Thomasson claims: "The conceptual choices we negotiate for in expressing metaphysical views are not merely verbal issues, they matter because what we call 'art', or a 'person', or a 'free action', has a deep and significant impact on our way of life" (117). This approach is appealing since it promises to avoid both the heavyweight burdens of classical metaphysics and the weightlessness of the more traditional versions of metaphysical deflationism. However, whether it will succeed is of course an open question.

In "Armchair Metaphysics Revisited: The Three Grades of Involvement in Conceptual Analysis," Frank Jackson argues that frequently a crucial step in the development of an adequate explanatory and predictive theory of a given phenomenon consists in finding the a priori properties to which that theory refers (as when one explains and predicts the floatation properties of an object by appealing to the property of density, which is a priori determined by its mass and volume). According to Jackson, that is the first level of conceptual analysis. The second is our ability to talk about a priori properties without knowing how in fact these properties are exactly determined (as when we can individuate in most cases the property of being elliptical without knowing the correct definition of ellipticity). Finally, the third level is reached when we articulates the correct ways in which a property is a priori determined (as when, for example, we get the formula that determines the exact extension of the concept "ellipsis," i.e., the kinds of locations of the points in space that determine the property of being elliptical). A priori properties are essential for understanding reality, Jackson argues, and so is the kind of conceptual analysis that makes it possible for us to understand those properties.

Jonathan Weinberg's "What Is Negative Experimental Philosophy Good For?" claims that we now have abundant evidence that the psychological resources we use in doing armchair philosophy (i.e., intuitions) are unreliable, since they are conditioned by a variety of factors that we are not able to control (such as biases depending on ethnicity, on the order of presentation of the alternatives, and even on the type of font of the presented text). Weinberg, however, does not claim that intuitions should be banned from philosophical methodology, only that their use should be supplemented, and corrected, with the resources the cognitive sciences offer. He writes: "It seems that one element of future philosophical progress may be for philosophers to learn similarly how to avoid letting their minds play tricks on them" (182). However, one question that this method leaves open is what use, if any, philosophers will be able to make of their intuitions, once those are free of all the alleged psychological imperfections.

Hans-Johann Glock defends the idea of "Impure Conceptual Analysis" -- which in his opinion is "both indispensable and tricky" -- in the many cases in which philosophy deals with issues that also interest science. In his opinion, on the one hand philosophy is not continuous with science, and even less a part of it; on the other hand it has no epistemic priority over science. "Philosophers," Glock writes, "ought not to shirk it by dabbling in science . . . and scientists should be duly grateful rather than hostile" (100). An important question for proponents of this method is what one should do when there is a conflict between a well-rooted philosophical intuition and scientific data. According to Huw Price, for example, "Philosophy properly defers to science, where the concerns of the two coincide". [4] Other philosophers, myself included, would take a more nuanced view, claiming there is not an a priori answer about what to do when such conflicts emerge.

The third part, "Between Analysis and the Continent," is the most original, covering several non-mainstream methodological views. In "Metaphysical Quietism and Everyday Life", David Macarthur offers an original defense of philosophical quietism -- the anti-metaphysical view implicitly developed by Wittgenstein and recently advocated by Richard Rorty and John McDowell. Macarthur defends that view against three main objections: (i) quietism arbitrarily ignores the very relevant questions of traditional metaphysics; (ii) it is self-refuting; (iii) it is an unambitious or defeatist view. Appealing to the later Wittgenstein, Macarthur argues that quietism recommends itself as a response to metaphysical dogmatism, and this has a clear value for our lives. He develops an astute analysis of how stereotyping (in the pejorative sense of the term) presupposes a dogmatic metaphysical view about people. His conclusions apply to metaphysics in general: "Quietist therapy is directed, in the first instance, at exposing and criticizing the empirical insensitivity of metaphysical thought and so the distortion of everyday language that ensues -- the details of which will take as many different forms as there are different kinds of metaphysical thinking" (268). A philosopher with a more optimistic view about metaphysics could respond that such cases  show that bad metaphysics can have very negative social influences and should be actively fought, but they do not prove that there are cannot be cases of good, and perhaps even necessary, metaphysics. Defending the idea of freedom and responsibility on a metaphysical basis, for example, does not necessarily have bad social consequences (it may have very good ones, for example in defending the idea that we should never punish the innocent, as some increasingly common forms of brutal utilitarianism urge).[5] Moreover, in general, one could claim that there are different forms of metaphysics; while some are certainly empirically insensitive, dogmatic and too abstract, others are not necessarily so.[6]

In "Life Changing Metaphysics: Rational Anthropology and Its Kantian Methodology" Robert Hanna identifies philosophy with a rational anthropology inspired by Kant that can generate life-changing politics. In "Collingwood's Idealist Metaontology: Between Therapy and Armchair Science," Giuseppina D'Oro appeals to Collingwood's conceptual idealism to articulate a view (which is intermediate between armchair metaphysics and Wittgenstenian therapeutic philosophy) that, in her opinion, is able to expose adequately "the irreducibly multi-faceted character of reality " (227). In "Pragmatism and the Limits of Metaphilosophy," Robert Talisse appeals to pragmatism -- taken as a metaphilosophical stance, not as a first-order program -- as "a way of arriving at and holding one's philosophical views, whatever they may be" (247). Finally, in "The Metaphilosophy of the Analytic-Continental Divide: From History to Hope", Robert Piercey compares Rorty's and Ricoeur's metaphilosophies, finding them surprisingly similar. They share a "metaphilosophy of historicity" (the idea that philosophy and history of philosophy are indispensable to each other, if they are not the same thing) and the "metaphilosophy of hope" (the idea that philosophy can generate human progress). According to Piercey, this striking metaphilosophical similarity suggests that the analytic-continental divide, as usually understood, is dubious. The evidence for this claim, however, is unconvincing, because most analytic philosophers would reject the metaphilosophy of historicity (and not a few would also reject the metaphilosophy of hope). Consequently, Rorty cannot be considered sufficiently representative of the analytic side of the divide.

The fourth and final part, is "Continental Perspectives". In "Phenomenological Method and the Achievement of Recognition: Who's Been Waiting for Phenomenology?" David Cerbone claims that from a methodological point of view phenomenology points to self-discovery conceived as an activity. The question he raises is how this fact can be reconciled with the existence of textbooks in phenomenology. His conclusion is that, if one wants to be faithful to the spirit of phenomenology, one should personally "re-perform" the investigations of such textbooks.

In "Existentialist Methodology and Perspective: Writing the First Person," Jack Reynolds and Patrick Stokes defend some core existentialist insights regarding the first-person perspective and the theory-practice relationship. They respond to the two basic objections raised today against existentialism: that it interprets lived experience in a dogmatic way, as a sort of "given", and that it is too radical in its practical consequences.

In "Hermeneutics and the Question of Method," Kristin Gjesdal criticizes Gadamer for objecting to the methodological approaches to hermeneutics by appealing to some ideas of Johann Gottfried Herder. In her view, hermeneutics is not a method for doing philosophy, but "a phenomenology of human existence in a historical-cultural world" (337).

Fabian Freyenhagen, in "Critical Theory's Philosophy," focuses on Adorno in order to discuss the controversial relationship between critical theory and traditional philosophy. Adorno, and more generally the Frankfurt school, criticize the traditional view of philosophy as a truth-conducive, systematic, and timeless enterprise, autonomous from the other disciplines and conceptually prior to them.

In "An Extension of Deconstructionist Methodology," Leonard Lawlor advocates Derridian deconstructionism as a way of freeing philosophy from the burdens of conventional thinking by both escaping metaphysics and undergoing a transformative experience. The deconstructionist method, however, does not appeal to common sense and consensus: "Thinking otherwise advocates change, not conformism" (396); in his view this implies the overcoming of all metaphysical dichotomies. The final goal of the deconstructionist method is "changing the addressees' mode of thinking -- and behavior -- so that it is free and creative" (396). But what does this amount to precisely? Lawlor's example is the death penalty: how should a philosopher decide whether to accept it or not? Since the conjunction of good and evil is "undecidable," since "no separation can be established between goodness and evil" (this dichotomy also has to be overcome!), then each philosopher should decide "whether to argue that a penalty like the death sentence cannot be applied in the name of goodness since the idea of goodness is necessarily contaminated by evil or to argue that the death sentence must be applied in the name of goodness since the evil of death is contaminated with goodness." (395). Lawlor concludes: "only through [the undecidability between good and evil] does one make a decision that is worthy of that name -- a decision that is free and not programmed by constants and universals" (395). Maybe we do not need constants and universals in order to judge the legitimacy of the death penalty; however, what a philosopher is allowed to say regarding that topic, once the deconstructionist method is adopted, is utterly unclear to this reviewer.

Finally, in "Pathological Experience: A Challenge for Transcendental Constitution Theory?", Jean-Luc Petit expounds an original proposal for a "naturalized phenomenology",by confronting Husserlian phenomenology with the experience of patients affected with Parkinson's disease.

This collection is worth reading for anyone interested in metaphilosophy, especially since it fairly covers the vast majority of philosophical methodologies on the market today. Unsurprisingly, the presuppositions, styles, and goals of the individual essays are extremely varied, and the assessment of their respective values will depend on a reader's philosophical taste. What this book strongly confirms, however, is that philosophy is now much more multifaceted than in any other period of its long history. Only the future will tell us if this pervasive diversity is a good thing.

[1] L. Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, Blackwell, 1967, §124.

[2] S. Kripke, Naming and Necessity, Blackwell, 1980, 42.

[3] A. Rosenberg, “Disenchanted Naturalism”, in B. Bashour and H.D. Muller (eds.), Contemporary Philosophical Naturalism and Its Implications, Routledge, 2014, 17.

[4] H. Price, “Naturalism without Representationalism,” in M. De Caro and D. Macarthur (eds.), Naturalism in Question, Harvard University Press, 2004, pp. 71-105; quote on 71.

[5] See M. De Caro and Lavazza, “Free Will as an Illusion: Ethical and Epistemological Consequences of an Alleged Revolutionary Truth,” Social Epistemology Review and Reply Collective, 3, 12, 2014, 40-50.

[6] See H. Putnam, “Naturalism, Realism, and Normativity,” Journal of the American Philosophical Association, 1, 2015, 312-328, for a defense of a moderate metaphysical attitude regarding the issue of realism.