The Cambridge Companion to Plato's Republic

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G. R. F. Ferrari (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Plato's Republic, Cambridge UP, 2007, 533pp., $30.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521548427.

Reviewed by Rachel Singpurwalla, University of Maryland, College Park



This anthology contains sixteen new essays on Plato’s Republic as well as a fine editor’s introduction and an excellent bibliography. There is no shortage of philosophical anthologies on the Republic, but this collection is distinctive in that a number of its contributors pay special attention to the literary features of the dialogue. The anthology includes, for example, essays that address questions about Plato’s use of literary techniques: Why does Plato make such heavy use of similes, images, and myths in the Republic (Yunis)? How does Plato use literary motifs from Homer and Hesiod for his own philosophical and rhetorical purposes (Halliwell, O’Connor)? In what sense is Plato aiming to supplant Homer by writing a philosophical epic of his own (Ferrari’s Introduction, Yunis)? In addition, the anthology includes essays by authors who emphasize the dramatic features of the dialogue to guide their interpretation of Plato’s philosophy (e.g., Blössner, Weiss). These authors hold, more or less explicitly, that we cannot understand Plato’s position by focusing on Socrates’ arguments alone, since Socrates makes certain arguments simply because they will be convincing to an interlocutor with a particular set of values and not necessarily because he endorses them himself. According to this view, appreciating the philosophical import of a dialogue involves attending to the complex interplay between the aim of the dialogue and the way in which the character of Socrates uses rhetoric to move his interlocutors towards a certain point of view.

The essays cover as many topics as the Republic itself and display an admirable range of interpretive approaches. One theme, however, recurs throughout the collection: the question of why the philosopher returns to ‘the cave’ of politics, despite the fact that he has no interest in ruling. This question is crucial for understanding Plato’s views on moral motivation and the relationship between justice and happiness; in spite of this, Plato leaves the answer somewhat open. Several authors in the anthology attempt to reconstruct Plato’s position, each drawing on different aspects of the Republic. Some find the answer in Socrates’ conversation with Thrasymachus in Republic I (Sedley, Weiss), others in his conception of education and politics (Morrison, Schofield), and others still in his account of the relationship between the philosopher and the forms (Miller).

The order of the essays follows the sequence in which topics are presented in Plato’s text. Nonetheless, I do not think this anthology as a whole is suitable for those new to the Republic. Many of the essays assume more than a passing acquaintance with both the Republic and the secondary literature, and some of them offer idiosyncratic interpretations without canvassing more standard views. For those familiar with the Republic, however, this anthology provides a rich source of novel ideas and approaches. Further, for those especially interested in literary themes and approaches to Plato, or in the problem of the philosopher-king’s motivation to rule, this collection is indispensable.

In what follows, I briefly summarize the essays, highlighting their original contributions and some points of contact among them. I hope this summary serves both to guide readers to those essays that may be of particular interest to them and to illustrate the diverse approaches to reading Plato collected in this valuable anthology.

The first three essays deal with big picture questions about the Republic. The Republic is not a typical piece of philosophical writing. It contains an argument for the value of justice, but the argument is presented in the context of a conversation between richly drawn characters, and its main points are often illustrated through similes, images, and myths. Why does Plato write this way? In "The Protreptic Rhetoric of Plato’s Republic", Harvey Yunis addresses the issues of the intended readership of the Republic and its distinctive style. Yunis argues that Plato’s purpose as a writer is not just to present philosophical arguments about the value of justice, but to present them in a way that would motivate those who read them to turn towards a just way of life. Thus, Plato employs rhetorical devises to harness the affective power of art, with the ultimate aim of inculcating philosophical values in his readers. Yunis argues that by writing this way, Plato aims to supplant Homer — the reigning master of affective art and conventional values.

In "The Place of the Republic in Plato’s Political Thought", C. Rowe argues that Plato’s political philosophy in the Republic is broadly consistent with the political views espoused in his other dialogues. Rowe begins by examining the conception of political philosophy found in Plato’s early or ‘Socratic’ dialogues, specifically the Gorgias and the Euthydemus. He argues that both hold that true statesmanship is a kind of philosophical or dialectical expertise and that the true aim of the statesman is to make people wise and knowledgeable about what is truly good and thus to make them happy. Rowe further argues that in the late dialogues, particularly the Politicus, Timaeus-Critias, and Laws, Plato retains these ideas, but thinks that the statesman will resort to instilling true beliefs (and not full-blown knowledge) in the citizens through prescriptions and laws instead of dialectical exchange. In the second part of the chapter, Rowe makes the case that the Republic fits this picture. More specifically, he maintains that Republic I, often thought to express ideas and methods similar to the early or ‘Socratic’ dialogues, argues for the claim that wisdom is essential for happiness, while the remainder of the Republic holds that it is the job of the statesman to instill it in the citizens, most often by imposing, through laws and institutions, the right kinds of judgments about how to live.

In “Rewriting the Poets in Plato’s Characters”, David O’Connor illustrates how Plato uses literary motifs from Homer and Hesiod to persuade his interlocutors (and readers) of the value of justice and philosophy. In the first part of this useful and interesting essay, O’Connor highlights the resonances between Homer’s tale of Odysseus’s visit to the underworld and various passages in the Republic. Perhaps most interestingly, O’Connor argues that there are important affinities between Homer’s depiction of death and the underworld and Socrates’ depiction of the cave, or the world of politics. O’Connor argues that this comparison is meant to cure Glaucon in particular of his worldly ambitions. In the second part of the essay, O’Connor focuses on Plato’s use of Hesiod’s story of the golden age of Cronus and the races of metals. He argues that Plato uses Hesiod’s tale of five ages of human history, each characterized by a particular race (gold, silver, bronze, heroic, and iron), to add a mythic undertone to key features of his politics, especially the class structure of the ideal city and the analysis of political and psychological degeneration in Republic VIII and IX.

The remainder of the essays follow the order of the topics discussed in the ten books of the Republic. In "Wise Guys and Smart Alecks in Republic I and II", Weiss argues that Socrates’ defence of justice is complete by the end of Republic I, and thus that the remainder of the Republic‘s case for justice is simply an expansion of these ideas. Weiss uses Socrates’ portrayal of his interlocutors to inform her interpretation. Socrates presents quick and flawed arguments in Republic I because Thrasymachus is a bullish interlocutor who has no real interest in hearing arguments on behalf of justice, but Socrates develops his argument further when he is talking with Glaucon and Adeimantus, since they are interested in hearing him defend justice. Perhaps the most striking feature of Weiss’s argument is her interpretation of Socrates’ claim that justice is good for its own sake and for its consequences. According to Weiss, Socrates thinks that justice is good in itself for the agent because it is a kind of harmony of the soul; justice is good for the consequences that it brings about for others because it requires that we act for the sake of the good of others. Weiss uses this interpretation to provide an answer to the vexed question of what motivates the philosopher in the ideal city to return to the ‘cave’ of politics to rule. On her view, the philosopher returns to the cave because he has a just soul and justice requires that he rule. A consequence of having a just soul, then, is deciding to rule (or act for the sake of the good of others). The act of ruling itself is not good for the philosopher; it is only good for those he rules.

In “Justice and Virtue: Inquiry into Proper Difference”, Aryeh Kosman considers Socrates’ account of justice, especially as presented in Republic II-IV, and in relation to the metaphysics presented later in the dialogue. Plato is often derided for having an obsessive focus on unity and uniformity. Kosman aims to deflate this standard view by showing that the virtue of justice is the virtue of proper differentiation, or a virtue that governs right and proper division. Kosman considers justice in the city and soul and argues that justice is a virtue of any complex and functionally differentiated entity in which what its parts do is determined by what they characteristically do or are good at doing. Kosman thinks that on this view, justice is a perfectly general principle of agreement between what something does and what it is. In this way, justice is a metaphysical and ontological notion, as well as a moral and political one. The universe as whole can be thought of as a functionally differentiated complex where ideally each thing performs the function appropriate to the kind of thing it is, which is determined by its form. In a just universe, the activity of each thing would be aligned with its form. According to Kosman, despite these metaphysical implications, Socrates’ account of justice is akin to common-sense accounts since in a just world only differences that make a difference are relevant to what sort of activities each person should perform.

In “The Noble Lie”, Malcolm Schofield attempts to understand the motivation for Plato’s infamous idea that the citizens of his ideal city should believe its charter myth, which includes the claims that all of the citizens share the same mother — the earth — and so are family, and that the gods fashioned each citizen with a certain type of soul that suits him or her to do a certain work for the city. In the first part of this fine essay, Schofield situates the morality of lying in both ancient and contemporary contexts and argues that Plato’s outlook, which espouses lying for the sake of a well-ordered society, conflicts with both. In the second part, Schofield argues that the Noble Lie is introduced to motivate the citizens, and in particular the rulers, to love and care for the city and to show their concern through doing the work of the city for which they are best suited. Schofield proceeds to argue for the striking claim that Socrates thinks that the Noble Lie — a wholesale political ideology emphasizing filial obligation — is the only way of motivating altruistic behavior. Schofield uses his account to propose his own answer to why the philosopher returns to the cave to rule. He argues that the Noble Lie, among other things, has inculcated the philosopher with feelings of filial concern and obligation that motivate him to rule for the sake of the citizens.

G. R. F. Ferrari’s “The Three-Part Soul” turns to the psychology of the Republic. Ferrari notes that Socrates’ conception of the parts of the soul, particularly the rational part, shifts from Republic IV to VIII and IX. While many commentators try to harmonize this difference by reading the latter into the former, Ferrari argues instead that by focusing on the differences we can learn more about what makes the philosopher superior to the just man described in Republic IV. Ferrari argues that in Republic IV, reason is cast in Humean terms: it does not have a goal of its own but rather determines how to satisfy the desires of the other parts of the soul. Socrates says that someone who is ruled by reason in this sense is just because that person has been acculturated to regard a self-disciplined and harmonious soul as characteristic of the best type of person, and spirit aspires to be the best type of person. In other words, his goals are set by a combination of acculturation and spirited desires. According to Ferrari, the figure of the philosopher introduced later in the Republic disrupts this pattern. When Socrates describes the philosopher, reason does have a passion of its own: to understand. Outwardly, the philosopher behaves in the same fashion as the individual described at the end of Republic IV. However, his motivations are not due to acculturation, but to reasoning about how to live the best kind of life. On this picture, reason treats ruling in the soul as a theoretical problem and thus ruling is a way of achieving its aim of understanding.

The next two authors consider the ideal city. In "Eros in the Republic", Paul Ludwig discusses the social reforms proposed in Republic V. Perhaps one of Socrates’ most striking proposals in the Republic is sexual communism, or the idea that wives and children should be shared. Why does Socrates advocate this? One reasonable answer is that Socrates is trying to exploit the facts of filial attachment for political purposes. More specifically, he is attempting to lessen our strong feelings of attachment for family members to eliminate potential conflicts between our love of family members and the good of the whole. At the same time, he is trying to extend those feelings to all of the citizenry to motivate proper concern for others. Aristotle criticizes this project; he argues that when filial feelings are lessened in this way, they lose their power to motivate strong concern. Ludwig counters that Socrates is at least partly immune to this criticism since another reason he has for proposing sexual communism is to encourage citizens to consort with bodies in the way that philosophers consort with the forms: free from the idea that the object of love is something that can be possessed or owned. Thus, sexual communism prepares future guardians to love the forms. Ludwig finds this sequence illustrated in both the Symposium and the Republic. Just as Diotima’s student in the Symposium loves a boy, then many, then laws and institutions, and then forms, so Glaucon is portrayed as loving boys, then political institutions, and finally the forms.

In “The Utopian Character of Plato’s Ideal City”, Donald Morrison continues the discussion of Socrates’ political proposals. How seriously does Plato intend us to take his utopian vision? Does he think his city is possible? In his helpful essay, Morrison argues that Socrates is serious about his proposals and that his utopia is meant to be a paradigm to which we should aspire. Morrison does, however, think that the ideal city would be very hard to come by. He notes that Socrates says that the city is possible if and only if philosophers become kings. If Socrates thinks the philosopher is someone who loves wisdom, however, then it is hard to see how the philosopher would make the city happy. If, on the other hand, he thinks the philosopher is someone who has wisdom, it is hard to see how we could find such a person. Is it possible that Socrates intends us to see these problems and that he does not think the ideal city is possible? According to the ‘Straussian Interpretation’, Socrates’ political proposals are ironic. One source of support for this interpretation is the issue of the philosopher’s return to the cave. Socrates seems to argue that the philosopher would knowingly sacrifice his own happiness to rule, but since this would be irrational Socrates must not intend us to take this idea seriously. Morrison rejects this line of interpretation and offers a third account of why the philosopher returns to the cave: the philosopher has been educated to be a patriot, and so sees his own well-being as intricately tied to the success of the city, which requires his rule. Morrison’s proposal here is similar to Schofield’s, who also argues that acculturation is the source of the philosopher’s motivation to rule.

The next three essays deal with the metaphysical and epistemological themes that run through the middle books of the Republic. In “Philosophy, the Forms, and the Art of Ruling” Sedley attempts to answer two questions: (i) why are philosophers equipped to rule? (ii) why do they undertake to rule? Sedley answers the first question by examining three passages: Republic V’s infamous argument for the claim that only philosophers have knowledge, the Ship of State image, and the Cave allegory. Sedley argues for a traditional interpretation of these passages: only forms can be known and particulars are the objects of belief. How, then, is philosophical knowledge meant to inform political activity, which inevitably deals with particulars? Sedley argues that the ultimate object of knowledge — the Good — is something like proportionality, understood in mathematical terms. Thus, the philosopher’s knowledge is essentially mathematical, and so we might think that the philosopher’s use of mathematics in civics is akin to our use of economics in political deliberations. Sedley thinks that this knowledge is necessary but not sufficient for being a good ruler, since the philosopher also needs the proper motivation to rule. Accordingly, Sedley presents his own answer to the question of why the philosopher returns to the cave. Like Weiss, Sedley finds the answer to this question in Republic I. He agrees with her that the craft of ruling is essentially altruistic or other-regarding in so far as the aim of the craft is to benefit the subjects. He follows the surface text of Republic I more closely, however, by endorsing Socrates’ claim that the reason the good person rules is that he does not want to be ruled by someone worse. Thus, on Sedley’s view, the philosopher does see making the choice to rule as in his own interest.

In “Sun and Line: The Role of the Good”, Denyer addresses Socrates’ conception of the good and the image of the line. Famously, Plato argues that the good is the cause of the intelligibility and being of the forms. Denyer argues that we can understand this if we focus on ideal artifacts. Everything about an ideal object is teleologically explicable. For example, every feature of an ideal wheel — e.g. that it is circular instead of oval, and that its axle is at the center — is explained by the fact that it is best for it to be that way. Can this teleological notion of the good apply to everything that Plato wants it to, particularly mathematical objects? To answer this question, Denyer provides an interpretation of the line, with a particular focus on its mathematical aspects. Denyer argues that just as the lower level of the line depicts the relationship between sensibles and their shadows, and the modes of thinking associated with each, the upper level of the line depicts the relationship between forms and their ‘shadows’, and the cognitive states associated with them. What are these ‘shadows’ of forms? Borrowing from Aristotle, Denyer argues that they are mathematical intermediates (for example, a straight line), which are distinct from sensibles in that they are eternal and unchanging, but also distinct from forms in that there are several mathematicals of a kind. Mathematical thought deals with these intermediates while intellect deals with forms, particularly mathematical forms, such as the triangle. Denyer argues that the good explains mathematical forms since their having the particular nature that they do makes order and beauty possible. He illustrates with an example from the Timaeus: if the ideal right angle did not provide a universal standard, then space would not be uniform, and the world would be messy and disordered. Such a world, Denyer concludes, would offend our sense of beauty, order, and perhaps even fairness.

The catalyzing idea for Mitch Miller’s essay, “Beginning the ‘Longer Way’”, is Socrates’ suggestion that there is a ‘longer and fuller way’ that we must take if we want to understand truly the soul and its virtues; this, presumably, is the road that the philosopher-king must travel. Since the philosopher’s higher education consists in mathematical studies, the bulk of Miller’s impressive essay consists in showing how these studies might turn the soul towards understanding the Good. According to Miller, each of the mathematical studies — calculation and arithmetic, plane geometry, solid geometry, astronomy, and harmonic theory — contributes to the ascent from the sensible. In other words, this course of study enables us to free ourselves from sense perception and the thought that the spatio-temporal world exhausts reality. The point of all this, however, is not to abandon the sensible world, but to understand its intelligible structure and so to understand the world in its totality. According to Miller, geometry and harmonics in particular enable us to understand the good. The study of geometry gets us to the concept of perfection since it examines entities like the perfect triangle. Harmonics, on the other hand, helps us to understand the complex unity that makes for wholeness and harmony. Miller uses this account of the good to provide yet another solution to the question of what motivates the philosopher to return to the cave to rule. Briefly, Miller argues that the philosopher loves the forms and the good and so wants to imitate them, and that this imitation is best achieved through educating the citizens of the polis.

The next two essays return, as the Republic does, to the topics of politics and psychology. Norbert Blössner’s “The City-Soul Analogy” provides an interpretation of this central feature of the Republic. Blössner’s essay contains an extremely helpful statement of Plato’s methodology, the basic tenets of which include three inter-related claims. First, Socrates is not a mouthpiece for Plato, but rather a character that fictionally interacts with various interlocutors in ways appropriate to them and their situation. Thus, the meaning of the text arises not merely from the sum total of statements, but from the drama in which those utterances are made. Second, the statements made in the dialogue can only be properly understood by paying attention to the context, such as the main aim of the dialogue and the interlocutors’ level of understanding. Finally, Plato works within a set of constraints, such as the need to show Socrates winning the argument, which requires that his interlocutors agree with each step of his argument. Blössner thinks this constraint sometimes requires Socrates to make fallacious arguments. The fact that the reader is meant to see that they are fallacious implies that the conclusions are provisional. This methodology guides Blössner’s interpretation of key features of the city-soul analogy. He argues that the analogy is entirely in the service of the main aim of the dialogue, which is to show that justice is essential for happiness. Two striking claims in particular flow from this idea. First, Socrates uses the claim that the city and soul are analogous to develop the Republic‘s psychology — one rich with vivid and colorful metaphors that are particularly well-suited to defend his main claim. Second, the claim that the city and soul are analogous constrains Socrates’ classification of the various types of city. In other words, his claims about certain constitutions are not a result of an empirical investigation, but are derived from his conception of the soul. Thus, we should not understand Socrates’ discussion of degenerate regimes as a quasi-historical critique of existing regimes, as many have done. Instead, the critique of cities is used solely to illuminate degenerate souls.

In “The Unhappy Tyrant and the Craft of Inner Rule”, Richard Parry examines the psychology of the tyrannical person described in Republic IX with a view to understanding his polar opposite, the just individual. According to Parry, Socrates thinks that having a certain character type depends on having both certain dispositions and certain beliefs about the value of those dispositions. The democratic character, for example, has unnecessary desires and believes that it is good to have such desires. The tyrannical character, on the other hand, is defined by his erotic passions and madness. That is, while the democratic man has an (admittedly flawed) justification for his way of life, the tyrant is protected from the need for justification by madness or by having a view of his soul that is wholly out of touch with reality. Parry argues that despite his madness, the tyrant is miserable and aware of it, since he cannot satisfy the desires of his rational and spirited parts. Socrates also argues that the tyrannical soul is filled with violence, while the just soul is in agreement with itself. What does this agreement consist in? While some have argued that it consists in the rational and non-rational parts sharing beliefs, Parry avoids attributing such judgments to the non-rational parts. He argues instead that the agreement consists in the fact that the lower parts do not raise faction against the ruling rational part. Parry argues that reason guarantees such agreement by shaping the appetitive part so as to promote, as stable dispositions, the tame necessary and beneficial appetites, and to rule out the unnecessary appetites.

In her pellucid essay, “What is Imitative Poetry and Why Is It Bad?” Jessica Moss tackles Socrates’ critique of poetry in Republic X. Moss’ task is to show how Socrates uses a metaphysical criticism of art — that it is a third remove from truth, or that it is imitative — to bolster his ethical criticism that it harms the soul. Moss begins by defining imitative art. She argues that imitative art imitates the way things appear. This is problematic, however, since how something appears does not necessarily reflect how it is. Moss argues that appearances are qualitatively distinct from the realities that underlie them: appearances are varied and contradictory, while realities are stable and uniform. Thus, imitative art misrepresents the objects it portrays. Why should this harm the soul? As Moss notes, Socrates is particularly concerned with the effects of imitative poetry on the soul. According to Moss, imitative poetry imitates appearances of human excellence, and not real human excellence. In other words, it portrays varied, contradictory characters as opposed to stable and uniform characters. This kind of poetry appeals to the non-rational parts of the soul, since these are the parts that are susceptible to and take pleasure in appearances. Accordingly, imitative poetry strengthens these parts of the soul and encourages us to respond inappropriately to mere appearances of excellence.

The anthology concludes with an essay by Stephen Halliwell, “The Life and Death Journey of the Soul: Interpreting the Myth of Er”. Halliwell begins with some methodological remarks on interpreting myths in Plato. He argues that ultimately there is no hard and fast distinction between myth and argument in Plato’s writing, which suggests that we must consider the Myth of Er as the final stage of his argument concerning the external rewards of justice and thus as a continuation of the argument begun in Republic II. Halliwell notes that we can interpret that myth either allegorically or literally, but that on either reading, the myth is hard to square with the rest of the Republic. If we interpret the myth allegorically — as an allegory for the effects of justice in this life, and not in the afterlife — then it is difficult to see why Socrates prefaces the myth with an argument for the immorality of the soul. If, however, we read the myth literally, then it suggests a strong determinism about the formation of our characters that is at odds with the Republic‘s emphasis on the effects of education and choice on character development. In response to this dilemma, Halliwell suggests that perhaps the myth’s persuasiveness occurs at the affective level, and that his interlocutors are simply supposed to feel that they should live their lives as if nothing but justice matters. Is Glaucon persuaded? Halliwell argues that Plato leaves the answer to this question open and that this invites the reader to consider the investigation incomplete and to return to the beginning.