The Cambridge Companion to Pragmatism

Placeholder book cover

Alan Malachowski (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Pragmatism, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 378pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521125802.

Reviewed by David Rondel, University of Nevada, Reno


This book, one of the most recent in Cambridge University Press's large and growing companion series, provides a well-rounded overview of American pragmatism's beginnings, its "revival" in the mid to late twentieth century, and some of the ways in which it might be "put to work" in addressing questions about aesthetics, politics, religion, law, and education.

The volume begins with an introduction by editor Alan Malachowski, which helpfully sets out American pragmatism's "orientation," a few of its guiding themes, along with a summary of several issues on which pragmatists have tended to diverge. One of these has to do with narrating the recent history of pragmatism itself. On the so-called "dominant" or "eclipse" story, pragmatism was "eclipsed by analytic philosophy" and "became a historical curiosity, residing as a dim relic in the museum of ideas." (3) While Malachowski wants his volume to offer "a relatively neutral overview of pragmatism" (xiii), and thus tries to avoid "taking a stand on issues concerning the respective merits of different forms of pragmatism" (xiv), he nonetheless agrees with other pragmatist commentators like Cheryl Misak and Robert Talisse in thinking that the "dominant narrative is badly mistaken." (9) When "the development of analytic philosophy . . . is examined more carefully," Malachowski writes, "it . . . becomes clear that rather than remaining dormant, or being discarded, in the face of that development, pragmatist ideas exerted a good deal of influence." (4)

The introduction is followed by 14 chapters, which are organized into three main sections. The first section -- "Classic Pragmatism" -- features one chapter each on Charles Sanders Peirce, William James, and John Dewey. While Malachowski is right to note in his preface that the essays on Peirce, James, and Dewey, "inevitably encroach on the territory covered by the Cambridge Companions already devoted to them," (xiv) these are rich and helpful pieces nonetheless.

In "'The Principle of Peirce' and the Origins of Pragmatism," Christopher Hookway, one of the world's most careful commentators on Peirce's work, follows the historical trajectory of Peirce's famous "pragmatic maxim" and explains its central role in the early development of pragmatism. Hookway takes pains to highlight that, for Peirce, pragmatism is "inseparable from realism" (20) and that the pragmatist method as Peirce conceived of it "employs the concept of a mind-independent reality." (21)

The realism at the heart of Peirce's pragmatism is usually contrasted with William James's strange metaphysical brew. For, while James admittedly sometimes makes realist noises, there are other moments at which he appears to let "experience" dictate to ontology: sometimes insisting that what shows up for us in experience is equivalent to what there really is, sometimes denying that there exists any "reality" at all not bound up with the point of view of some lived experience. The next essay, Malachowski's "James's Holism: The Human Continuum," argues that James's "holism" -- understood as "a picture, not a theory" (39) -- holds the key to understanding both the "pluralism" for which James is famous and his pragmatism more generally. James's holism tilts toward the continuousness of things, and thus rejects many of the "dualistic representations" (40) philosophy has been furnished with.

The third and final essay of section I, David Hildebrand's "Dewey's Pragmatism: Instrumentalism and Meliorism," gives an admirably rich overview of John Dewey's philosophy, focusing on four inter-related facets of his thought: mind, inquiry, growth, and wisdom. While he covers a lot of ground, Hildebrand does well to connect Dewey's naturalistic, functional account of mind with his theory of instrumentalist inquiry, showing how his "organic and interactional" psychology lets us think of inquiry, not as the quest for timeless truth or unmovable certainty, but rather as a series of "processes of active thinking and problem solving." (68)

Section II -- "Pragmatism Revived" -- features 6 essays on pragmatism's encounter with, and reception of, figures like Hegel, Wittgenstein, Heidegger, and Quine, along with important chapters on the neopragmatisms of Hilary Putnam and Richard Rorty. The word "revived" here is slightly misleading given Malachowski's repudiation of the "eclipse narrative," but the papers nevertheless shed valuable light on pragmatism's affinities with some of these major philosophical figures.

In "W.V.O Quine: Pragmatism Within the Limits of Empiricism Alone," Isaac Nevo argues that, despite having formally rejected it, Quine made "contributions to pragmatism that no student of that school can safely ignore." (83) Focusing on the holism for which he is famous, Nevo shows how Quine helped shape the thinking of subsequent pragmatists, particularly Rorty and Putnam, on issues like truth and the fact/value distinction.

Richard Bernstein, in "Hegel and Pragmatism," tells a long and synoptic story about the influence of Hegel on pragmatism. Beginning with the classical trio of Peirce, James, and Dewey (though focusing mostly on Dewey, in whose thinking Hegel was said to have left a "permanent deposit"), moving to the "incipient" Hegelianism of Wilfred Sellars, and concluding with the so-called "Pittsburgh Hegelians" -- John McDowell and Robert Brandom -- Bernstein shows how pragmatist thinkers, over the course of 150 years, have "detranscendentalized Kant and incorporated Hegelian motifs." (121)

Mark Okrent ("Heidegger's Pragmatism Redux") argues for a broader and looser application of the term "pragmatism." Pragmatism, on this proposed view, is distinguished in virtue of its practice-centric slant on the issue of "what it is for an agent to be intentionally engaged with a world." (126) By this standard, many philosophers not commonly associated with the pragmatist tradition -- the early Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, Hubert Dreyfus, Daniel Dennett and Alva Noë, among others -- all count as pragmatists. (133)

In "Practicing Pragmatist-Wittgensteinianism," Phil Hutchinson and Rupert Read explore what they call the "Wittgenstein-pragmatism nexus" and consider what it would mean to "write authentically as a Pragmatist-Wittgensteinian." (170) They interestingly examine what this might come to in the field of environmentalism, drawing the contrast between the pessimism of Jerry Williams and Shaun Parkman and the "scientistic, techno-fixing, consumeristic worldview" (176) of much environmentalist writing, on the one hand, and the "middle way" and "therapeutic" brand of thinking they attribute to the would-be Pragmatist-Wittgensteinian, on the other.

David Macarthur, in "Putnam, Pragmatism and the Fate of Metaphysics," argues that Putnam is indebted to the pragmatist tradition, among other reasons, in virtue of the "deep ambivalence towards metaphysics" (189) that features prominently in his work. Macarthur contends that Putnam is best understood as occupying an attitude toward metaphysics that lies somewhere between James and Dewey. For Macarthur, Putnam's is "an uneasy position that is not without internal tension." (198) For, while clearly critical of ambitious, Realist metaphysical programs, Putnam, rather unlike Rorty, is eager to salvage a "common sense attitude toward the world." (199)

Section II concludes with yet another contribution from Malachowski. Malachowski has been one of the more astute and sensitive writers on Rorty, and this shines through in his balanced and thoughtful "Imagination Over Truth: Rorty's Contribution to Pragmatism." Malachowski helps situate Rorty in the larger tradition of American pragmatism, focusing on, among other issues, Rorty's repudiation of "experience" as the proper locus of philosophical reflection. This certainly puts Rorty at odds with the classical trio of Peirce, James, and Dewey. Yet, as Malachowski also argues, the Romantic, cultural-critical and imaginative aspects of his thought bring into focus "the intriguing prospects that Rorty has made possible by his own endlessly fruitful, insightful and provocative encounters with pragmatism." (225)

The volume's final section -- "Pragmatism at Work" -- offers five papers on pragmatism's implications for feminism, education, aesthetics, religion, and law. Marjorie Miller's "Pragmatism and Feminism" provides a rich and far-reaching discussion of the resources in pragmatism available to feminist thinkers. While Miller lauds earlier work at the intersection of pragmatism and feminism -- by Judy Whipps and Charlene Haddock Seigfried, for instance -- and while she is for the most part friendly to Dewey's egalitarian vision, she is also skeptical about the usefulness of Dewey's egalitarian ideal for feminist aims. "It sounds so inspiring," she says, but a view like Dewey's will invariably depend on the way the community defines 'need' and 'capacities'. Miller worries that these definitions may be "severely detrimental to women." (239)

Carol Nicholson's "Education and the Pragmatic Temperament" argues for "a broader view of pragmatism as a habit of mind that is open to uncertainty, change and different points of view." (250) "The pragmatist temperament" is her name for this "least common denominator of the many varieties of pragmatism." (267) Nicholson thinks that understanding pragmatism by way of its temperament is preferable to the "prevailing interpretation" -- according to which pragmatism is understood merely as an academic movement taking place within a few philosophy departments in the United States -- because the latter has had the effect of limiting pragmatism's "potential to influence education in the ways that the early pragmatists anticipated." (250) Nicholson's invocation of "temperament" clearly involves a nod to James, who famously distinguished between the "Tender-Minded" and "Tough-Minded" philosophical temperaments in his 1906 Pragmatism lectures. Yet there are also important (though admittedly hard to pin down) distinctions of temperament internal to pragmatism itself. Surely, what separates those in contemporary pragmatist circles who take Peirce as their main inspiration and those who instead follow James and Dewey is not wholly doctrinal. Much of it, one imagines, has to do with something like temperament. This does not mean that there is no such thing as the "pragmatist temperament" after all, but only that it may be more finely grained and variegated than Nicholson sometimes seems to suppose.

In "Dewey's Pragmatic Aesthetics: The Contours of Experience," Garry Hagberg contends that, on Dewey's view, the central aim of aesthetic theory is "the full elucidation" of the true work of art. (272) Dewey's approach, Hagberg correctly notes, draws on the full spectrum of human experience. This includes, on the one hand, "the human conditions and context from which [a work of art] emerge," and, on the other, "the human consequences it engenders in actual life-experience." (272) Hagberg perceptively argues that Dewey's approach has at least two attractive consequences for the theory of art. First, it rejects the kind of "common conception" according to which whole artworks exist merely -- or mainly -- as physical objects, separable from human experience. Second, Dewey's approach helps us more clearly understand the "tightly intertwined processes of aesthetic expression, artistic creation and the creative role of the spectator." (292)

Anton Van Niekerk's "Pragmatism and Religion" provides an interesting discussion of the approach to religion adopted by James, Dewey, and (towards the end of his career, especially) Rorty. While Van Niekerk's "critical remarks" at the end of his contribution are noticeably short, the chapter as a whole does well to show how different pragmatist thinkers have understood and evaluated religion in importantly different ways.

The volume concludes with a judicious and well-argued essay ("Radical Pragmatism") by Michael Sullivan and Daniel Solove. They contest the "thin" account of pragmatism held by Richard Posner, and defend in its place a thicker, more radical, Dewey-inspired account. They also reject Posner's claim -- shared by Rorty and others -- that pragmatism lacks "political valence." On Posner and Rorty's view, the connections between one's views on (merely) philosophical topics like the correspondence theory of truth, say, and one's political commitments are looser and more pliable than Sullivan and Solove maintain. Sullivan and Solove rejoin that Posner and Rorty are guilty of conflating "philosophy" as the name of an academic discipline, with the more general (and etymological) meaning of the term, according to which philosophy is understood as a kind of inquiry and wisdom. Understood as a species of the latter, not the former, Sullivan and Solove conclude that "Pragmatism is anything but banal -- it is radical." (343)

Like many Cambridge Companions, this is an admirably well-edited collection, artfully blending historical, philosophical, and practical perspectives. American pragmatism is certainly large and flexible enough to have made it impossible to include everything. The volume lacks any discussion of the important literature at the intersection of pragmatism and race (think here, among many others, of Cornel West, Eddie Glaude, Shannon Sullivan, and Paul Taylor). There is also very little on the distinctively American sources from which early pragmatists took inspiration (think here of the importance of figures like Emerson, Whitman, Thoreau, and Jonathan Edwards). As always with a volume of this kind, different readers are likely to complain about the prominence or lack of prominence of different strains of pragmatist thought. Some readers will worry that contemporary "linguistic pragmatists" like Brandom or Huw Price have not been given their proper due. Pragmatists with more "classical" tastes may similarly worry about certain emphases and exclusions. But if its overall goal is that readers be "given a picture of pragmatism in the round," (xiv) the volume is clearly a success. It will serve as an excellent resource for students and scholars of American pragmatism, both in its classical and contemporary versions.