The Cambridge Companion to Rawls

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Freeman, Samuel (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Rawls, Cambridge University Press, 2003, 585pp, $24.00 (pbk), ISBN: 0521657067.

Reviewed by Wilfried Hinsch , University of the Saarland


The Cambridge Companion to Rawls, edited by Samuel Freeman, will prove a supportive and reliable companion to all those who turn to moral or political philosophy and feel the need to study the work of John Rawls more carefully. Freeman has brought together articles from more than a dozen distinguished contemporary philosophers dealing with different aspects of Rawls’ work. The late Burton Dreben contributes a lecture on the significance of Rawls’ idea of a distinctively ’political’ liberalism, and Thomas Nagel gives a well-balanced account of Rawls’ somewhat exceptional place in the tradition of liberalism. Joshua Cohen and Amy Gutman discuss Rawls’ contribution to democratic theory. Their articles are complemented by Frank Michelman’s essay on Rawls’ understanding of the ’constitutional essentials’ and the role of judicial review in liberal democracies. Philippe van Parijs and Norman Daniels explain the details of social and economic justice and Rawls’ idea of democratic equality. Thomas Scanlon writes instructively on the original position and public justification from a reflective equilibrium perspective, and there is another article on public reason by Charles Larmore. Onora O’Neill explains the differences between Kantian and Rawlsian constructivism in moral and political theory, and Samuel Sheffler highlights some structural affinities between Rawls’ theory of justice and utilitarian theories. Stephen Mulhall and Adam Swift defend Rawls against the most prominent communitarian charges but not against all. They “hope to put an end to those misunderstandings and misattributions that continue to divert intellectual attention from the real and important issues raised by the communitarian critique” (Companion 461). And last but certainly not least, Martha Nussbaum gives an unexpectedly sympathetic account of how much of the prevailing feminist criticism can be accommodated within the framework of justice as fairness. Freeman himself contributes not only a long and helpful introduction, summarizing the main lines of argument in . Theory of Justice, Political Liberalism and The Law of Peoples, but also an instructive article on the congruence of the right and the good. For good measure, the volume also contains a highly informative index of the kind we already learned to appreciate in the books of John Rawls. What is missing, though, are one or two articles on The Law of Peoples. Freeman has a brief account of the book in his “Introduction,” but given the philosophical and political relevance of Rawls’ understanding of international justice, this is hardly enough. Rather sooner than later, this shortcoming should be mended in one of the future editions of the Companion, which should also give Mard Rawls due credit for the wonderful painting of her husband shown on the cover.

It is, however, not just the index that makes the Companion a worthy tribute to both the philosopher and teacher John Rawls. It is above all the quality of the contributions. Indeed, it is quite impressive to see distinguished philosophers—many of them have been Rawls’ students at Harvard—restraining their more personal ambitions and leaving aside their own projects and favorite arguments to give Rawls center stage and to explain his moral and political philosophy. The contributors almost never make their points as competing critiques. They write in the spirit of sympathetic interpreters who carefully avoid easy criticism and eagerly clarify common misunderstandings. All contributors also take great care to substantiate their interpretive statements with quotes and ample references. For readers who are already well acquainted with Rawls’ work, this may occasionally (but not often) seem somewhat pedestrian, but students and new readers, the primary addressees of the Companion, will certainly appreciate it. They are given reliable information from first-rate sources and have the additional benefit of seeing distinguished philosophers exercise the virtues of hermeneutic modesty and carefulness. The Companion clearly exemplifies what John Rawls himself thought about the adequate treatment of great philosophical works. In the words of Barbara Herman, “At the centre of his thought about this history [of moral philosophy] is the idea that in the great texts of our tradition we find the efforts of the best minds to come to terms with many of the hardest questions of how we have to live our lives. Whatever their flaws, superficial criticism of these texts is always to be resisted (my emphasis).”1

Rawls’ work occupies a special place in the liberal tradition of political thought that goes back to Locke, Kant, and Mill. . Theory of Justice and Political Liberalism did not only contribute to a general revival of liberal thinking in the last decades. Both works profoundly changed the ways in which we conceive of liberalism and its tenets today. As Nagel points out, Rawls developed the philosophical and methodological foundations of liberalism further than any other philosopher before him, and he broadened the scope of liberal ambitions in unprecedented ways. The two perhaps most important innovations of Rawls are (1) the integration of ideas of social and economic equality into a liberal theory of justice and (2) the exposition of a distinctively ’political’ liberalism that no longer relies on contested substantive values of personal autonomy and individual flourishing but on a more general idea of respect for persons and their ways of life. Both innovations carry Rawlsian liberalism way beyond its classical forerunners and account in Nagel’s view for much of the controversy aroused by . Theory of Justice and Political Liberalism.

Political liberalism may be characterized as the attempt to justify principles of political justice and legitimacy solely on the basis of premises that cannot be reasonably rejected. It is an exercise of accommodation aimed at finding a shared basis of values and principles for public political argument and decision making that proves to be acceptable at least to all reasonable people in a free society irrespective of whether their more specific views are liberal or non-liberal, religious or nonreligious, the only constraint being that certain minimal standards of ’reasonableness’ be fulfilled. The aim is to identify what Rawls has called the ’public reason’ of a liberal and democratic society.

Many liberals, however, are not yet persuaded by a liberalism that is not only compatible with a certain range of broadly liberal positions but also with all kinds of non-liberal views and even, as Nagel has it, with “religious orthodoxy”. Many non-liberals, on the other hand, seem to shun ’political liberalism’ as simply another attempt to pursue liberal partisan politics under the camouflage of an allegedly all-embracing universalism. Still, it seems hard to deny that the very liberal idea of legitimate government presupposes at least the possibility of reasonable consent on the side of the governed. And this requirement of reasonable consent has a price, as Frank Michelman states in his article (Companion 414), namely not to invoke reasonably contested conceptions of the good (and the right), be they liberal or non-liberal, in the public justification of norms that apply to all citizens whatever their particular moral or religious viewpoints and doctrines.

From a more traditional liberal vantage point, Rawls’ second principle of justice (requiring fair equality of opportunity for all and maximal social and economic advantages for the least privileged members of society) may appear much closer to European socialism than to classical liberalism with its more narrowly defined focus on personal freedom and political equality. Moreover, the kind of redistribution needed in order to achieve social justice in the Rawlsian sense can be effected only by a much more developed and powerful state than would seem acceptable to those liberals who, following Wilhelm von Humboldt and John Stuart Mill, see strong reasons to impose rather strict limits on the range of legitimate state action. Facing the challenge of classical liberalism, the strength of the Rawlsian position is, as Nagel points out, that it does not simply combine ideas of individual liberty, from the liberal tradition, and social equality, from the socialist tradition, in a somewhat novel way. Rather, Rawls constructed an argument (represented in the model construction of the ’original position’) by means of which specific requirements of social and economic equality are derived from exactly the same set of premises (ideas of moral agency and the equality of persons) from which the equal personal and political liberties of the more confined classical liberalism derive.

Next to liberalism, the tradition of democratic thought provides a natural background for an assessment of Rawls’ moral and political philosophy. Cohen and Gutman maintain in their articles that even though Rawls says little about specific democratic institutions in . Theory of Justice and Political Liberalism, both works contain significant contributions to democratic theory. . Theory of Justice presents a theory of justice the principles of which not only prescribe a constitutional democratic regime, but also yield a set of rather specific normative standards for the appraisal of existing political institutions and programs. Both Gutman and Cohen emphasize that what democracy is ultimately about is not majority rule but political equality, which in turn is based on the more fundamental idea of the citizen as a moral person with the capacities necessary for an autonomous life and fair social cooperation.

It is the idea of the citizen as a moral person with equal claims to participate in the political processes of collective decision making that gives rise to the problem of public justification that Rawls addressed in Political Liberalism and that motivated his conception of ’public reason.’ According to Rawls, whenever ’constitutional essentials’ or matters of basic justice are at stake, the use of political power needs to be justified in terms of reasons that are capable of being publicly recognized by citizens who hold incompatible comprehensive views about the ultimate ends and values of life.

Both Gutman and Cohen have misgivings as to whether Rawls gave sufficient attention to the fact that reasonable disagreement is ubiquitous and not confined to the realm of comprehensive religious or philosophical doctrines. There is no denying that reasonable disagreement permeates the domain of the political—witness the public debates in liberal democracies about the more specific requirements of social justice and about the appropriate constitutional regulations concerning pornography, abortion, or same-sex-marriages. But there is no reason, either, to assume that Rawls intended to deny the obvious when he developed his conception of public reason and maintained that important constitutional issues be settled on the basis of reasons acceptable to all citizen whatever their more comprehensive religious or philosophical views. In Political Liberalism Rawls says: “One difficulty is that public reason often allows more than one reasonable answer to any particular question … public reason does not ask us to accept the very same principles of justice … . We should sincerely think that our view of the matter is based on political values everyone can reasonably be expected to endorse … . A vote can be held on a fundamental question as on any other; and if the question is debated by appeal to political values and citizens vote their sincere opinion, the ideal is sustained” (Companion 241). It is noteworthy, then, how little inclined Gutman and Cohen seem to be to spell out the consequences of reasonable disagreement in politics as regards the relationship between democracy and justice. Cohen’s article simply ends with an enigmatic note and an open question: “… we cannot expect the most reasonable democratic society to be founded on an agreement about justice. So how might the most reasonable conception of justice [i.e., justice as fairness] be achieved in the most reasonable form of democracy?” (Companion 131)

Gutman has a handful of proposals for how to deal with reasonable disagreement in politics: for instance, show respect to those who reasonably oppose your political opinions, offer civic friendship, be ready to meet halfway. They are all well taken and refer to important virtues of a democratic citizenry. Still, Gutman’s precepts of civility clearly miss an important point. It is agreed that reasonable disagreement in politics is often a disagreement about how to spell out the requirements of political or social justice in a given case. Now, from a contractualist point of view, reasonable disagreement about justice means that to the extent that there is disagreement, the content of justice is indeterminate. If we think of principles of justice as principles that cannot be reasonably rejected, this is a conclusion we can hardly avoid. It follows that, whenever we run into a reasonable disagreement, there are no determinate requirements of justice. Justice ceases to show us the way. Still, we may need a collectively binding decision. It is a platitude of political thinking that the need of binding regulations by far exceeds what can be achieved consensually, and this is true even if we talk about ideal or hypothetical consensus and confine ourselves to the constitutional essentials and matters of basic justice.

Let us say, in ideal theory a reasonable disagreement is a disagreement with regard to which none of the parties involved is subject to rational or moral criticism. The claims put forth by the parties are not based on recognizably false or incomplete information, or on unsound reasoning, and they do not grossly violate agreed upon requirements of reciprocity and impartiality. In such a situation a further exchange of arguments would not seem to be of much help if we assume that effective arguments always involve some kind of rational or moral criticism. Still, a continuation of public deliberation may be worth the effort. The parties may find a compromise or an arrangement that, at least for the time being, settles their dispute. But, of course, we know that it is not always possible to strike a deal or to find a compromise. Sometimes all arguments have been exchanged, all deals have been made, and all compromises have been tried, and still there may be no agreement on how to proceed. In such a situation . non-argumentative collective decision-making procedure may be the only way to find a collectively binding decision that can be publicly justified even though it cannot be justified in terms of reasons or arguments that would find universal approval. In a democracy this would often be a vote in accordance with majority rule. Indeed, given the principle of political equality and given the well-known properties of majority rule as a decision-making procedure (giving equal weight to all votes, neutrality toward all alternatives), majority rule may be just what we need in order to deal in a fair and publicly justifiable way with reasonable disagreements in politics. Hence, given the fact of reasonable disagreements in the political domain, principles of justice—for instance the principles of justice as fairness—have to be complemented by principles of procedural decision making capable of resolving disagreements that cannot be resolved by public reason. What we need in addition to a substantive theory of political justice, then, is a theory of procedural legitimacy, explaining the appropriate non-argumentative ways of resolving reasonable disagreements in a society of free and equal citizens.

Gutman takes a kind of critical stance toward majority rule and claims, in line with what Rawls says in . Theory of Justice, that like other decision-making rules (unanimity, plurality vote) it has a merely instrumental value as a mechanism of imperfect procedural justice for the achievement of just outcomes as judged by independent standards. Given the fact of a reasonable pluralism in politics, however, this cannot be the final word. In cases of reasonable disagreement about questions of political justice, there simply is no independent standard of what a just outcome should look like. Therefore, we need a non-argumentative (formal) decision-making rule to resolve the impasse resulting from this indeterminacy. It is at this point that an element of pure procedural legitimacy (rather than pure procedural justice) comes in. As a collective decision-making rule that gives equal weight to all votes and is neutral toward all alternatives (including the status quo), majority rule may prove to be the best way to guide us where the principles of justice are silent. Hence if properly spelled out, Rawls’ idea of a distinctively political liberalism in which the ideas of liberal legitimacy and reasonable disagreement figure so prominently may be even more hospitable to democratic thinking than Cohen and Gutman seem willing to concede.


1. John Rawls’ Lectures on the History of Moral Philosophy, ed. by Barbara Herman, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard U.P. 2000, Herman’s introduction, p. xi.