The Cambridge Companion to Renaissance Philosophy

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James Hankins (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Renaissance Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 430pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521608930.

Reviewed by E. Jennifer Ashworth, University of Waterloo


The Cambridge Companion to Renaissance Philosophy offers two challenges. The first concerns the very nature of philosophy: is it moral formation, esoteric wisdom, cosmological speculation, or, more prosaically, an academic discipline using logical tools to discuss metaphysical and epistemological issues? The second concerns our mistaken views of the Renaissance: was it a period in which Plato and the new philosophers of nature triumphed over medieval Aristotelian obscurantism, or was it "a swampland inhabited," among others, "by wild-eyed magicians and Naturphilosophen, as fertile in propagating new ideas as they were incapable of defending them" (p. 339)? The answer to the second question turns out to be, "on the whole, neither"; the answer to the first question is left as an exercise for the reader.

With this welcome addition to its series of companions to philosophy, the Cambridge University Press continues its service to those interested in the lengthy period from the mid-fourteenth century to the early seventeenth century. The press has already produced The Cambridge History of Renaissance Philosophy (1988) and the monumental Cambridge History of Seventeenth-Century Philosophy (1998), but these are aimed at a scholarly readership, and there has been little to attract students and non-specialists. It is true that the series of Cambridge companions to literature includes The Cambridge Companion to Renaissance Humanism (1996), several chapters of which pertain to philosophy, but the philosophy series up to now had a conspicuous gap between the companion to William of Ockham (d. 1347) and the companion to Thomas Hobbes (b. 1588).

In his attempt to fill this gap of two and a half centuries, the editor, James Hankins, faced a massive challenge. He had to come to grips not only with the multiplicity of schools and movements to be covered, but with the impact of various historical developments including the invention of printing, the rediscovery of ancient works, the European discovery of the Americas and the first voyages to China and Japan, the Protestant Reformation and the Catholic Counter-Reformation, and changes in educational systems. Moreover, he had to strike a balance between providing the reader with necessary background information, introducing the reader to individual thinkers, and giving a general overview without getting swamped in details. At the same time, he had to ensure that the presentation of the material would appeal not only to intellectual historians but also to contemporary philosophers. Hankins tackled all these problems with considerable, if varying, success. The book has sixteen contributors, including Hankins himself, and, leaving aside Hankins' substantial introduction and conclusion, the remaining sixteen chapters fall roughly into three groups. Four chapters are designed to place Renaissance thought and thinkers into their historical context. Two of the most readable chapters in the book belong in this first category. Peter Harrison examines the impact of Protestantism on philosophy, with respect to such notions as justification, personal autonomy, and the status of moral law. Ann M. Blair provides many fascinating details about the organization of knowledge, from the writing of history to the provision of library catalogues and collections of natural specimens. In addition, Robert Black discusses the philosopher's place in Renaissance culture, and Hankins provides a useful overview of early humanism and scholasticism which concludes with a study of Petrarch.

The second group of five chapters falls under the heading "Continuity and Revival". Luca Bianchi, Christopher S. Celenza and Jill Kraye provide useful, clear accounts of developments in the Aristotelian tradition, and of the revivals of Platonic and Hellenistic philosophy, while Dag Nikolaus Hasse offers a very informative study of the impact of Arabic philosophy. He adds a noteworthy appendix (pp. 134-136) which lists Renaissance Latin translations of Arabic philosophy from 1450 to 1700. The section concludes with an illustrated chapter on magic by Brian P. Copenhaver which is entirely devoted to Marsilio Ficino, without any mention of later authors such as Agrippa who also wrote influential works on magic and the occult. While this narrowing of the topic makes for enjoyable reading, it does not help the person who wants to know to what extent and why Renaissance thinkers were preoccupied with such matters.

The third group of seven chapters falls under the heading "Toward Modern Philosophy" and is designed to provide the reader with an account of specifically Renaissance developments in philosophy. Instead of being organized around such familiar themes as epistemology, the mind-body problem, philosophy of science and so on, it combines some discussion of individual thinkers with focus on particular problems.

One of the two chapters devoted to individual thinkers is Lodi Nauta's discussion of Lorenzo Valla and the rise of humanist dialectic. With exemplary clarity, Nauta shows how humanism "opened up new ways of reading and composing texts" and thus made a significant "move towards a new hermeneutics" (p. 207). On the other hand, his contribution shows one of the perhaps unavoidable weaknesses of the book, in that there is nowhere any sustained discussion of the often very interesting developments in the medieval tradition of thought about logic and language. The other chapter devoted to an individual thinker is that by Dermot Moran entitled "Nicholas of Cusa and modern philosophy." This is the least successful chapter in the book, largely owing to its poor organization of some very complicated material. It also displays a lack of balance, in that Nicholas of Cusa gets more attention than any other thinker, while being in many ways of lesser importance. He was certainly both prolific and controversial, but his actual influence seems to have been quite small, and Moran's speculations about his 'modernity' are unconvincing. He does not warrant a single reference in The Cambridge History of Seventeenth-Century Philosophy, unlike others, notably Suarez, who are paid far less attention in this work despite their enduring importance.

Finally, five chapters focus on a selection of problems. Paul Richard Blum takes up the theme of the immortality of the soul, a subject of considerable importance given that the Fifth Lateran Council in 1513 had defined it as a dogma of the Catholic Church, an event which was to have an impact on Descartes's Meditations, quite apart from the controversies it aroused at the time. Blum's chapter is tightly packed with material, but his explanation of the philosophical and religious issues, including the relationship of this new dogma to the basic Christian doctrine of the resurrection of the body, is confused. Moreover, too many important epistemological issues are passed over with little or no explanation. A case in point is the brief, misleading mention of objective and formal concepts on p. 219. This well-established medieval distinction between a concept as an act of mind (the formal concept) and its content (the objective concept), whether that content was to be construed as having a status of its own, or as in some way identical to an external referent, played an important role in epistemology and philosophy of mind, and is particularly relevant to understanding Descartes's first proof of God's existence in his Meditations. It can also be used to illustrate one of the main difficulties in discussing Renaissance philosophy, that of trying to map Renaissance divisions onto modern interests. Objective concepts were typically discussed in commentaries on Aristotle's Metaphysics, in sections on the analogy of being; whereas philosophy of mind was often subsumed under natural philosophy; and epistemology did not form a recognized branch of philosophy at all.

A wide range of interesting material is ably covered by John P. Doyle in a chapter entitled "Hispanic scholastic philosophy." The title is slightly misleading, in that the casual reader might suppose that the chapter concerns only what happened in the Iberian peninsula as opposed to the rest of the world, but, as Doyle makes clear, there are three reasons why this is wrong. First, Iberian philosophers studied and taught in a variety of places, from Rome to Mexico City. Second, they provided a curriculum for the rest of Europe, particularly through the Jesuit ratio studiorum, which was to govern Descartes's studies at La Flèche. Indeed, in the seventeenth century, Jesuit textbooks, in the form of commentaries on Aristotle, were even used in China and Japan. Third, many of their works were of great philosophical significance. The Spanish conquest of the New World evoked deep discussions of international law and the rights of indigenous populations to just treatment; theological issues led to elaborate discussions of divine foreknowledge and human freedom; and Francisco Suarez produced the wide-ranging and influential Metaphysical Disputations of 1597, read by both Descartes and Leibniz. What struck me about this chapter was its brevity, in relation to the rest of the book. The editor clearly chose to focus on the thinkers and issues that are most usually associated with the Renaissance, but such a focus tends to play down the very large role of academic philosophers working within universities and theological colleges. Only Doyle, and, to a lesser extent, Bianchi, pay due attention to this role.

Doyle's chapter points to another, probably unavoidable, problem with the way the book was organized. In conjunction with the excellent chapter on humanistic and scholastic ethics by David A. Lines and the equally excellent chapter on political theory by Eric Nelson, called "The problem of the prince", it allows the reader to become acquainted with a number of themes in moral and political philosophy, but these themes are not brought together under one heading. However, I said that this problem was "probably unavoidable", because when complex themes are brought together in one chapter, the result tends to be an unreadable sequence of details.

The last chapter to be discussed, "New visions of the cosmos" by Miguel A. Granada, raises another issue, that of how far contemporary philosophers should be seeking 'conversational partners' in the past. Granada offers a clear account of the cosmological speculations of Bernardino Telesio, Francesco Patrizi, Giordano Bruno, and Tommaso Campanella. These men were obviously important for our understanding of the intellectual history of the late sixteenth and early seventeenth centuries, and no introduction to Renaissance philosophy would be thought complete without a discussion of their views. In his concluding chapter, Hankins gives a spirited defence of the view that we should endeavour to read past thinkers "with a certain humility and respect" and not turn philosophy into "anachronistic monologue" (p. 341). Yet it is difficult to see how weight can be given to philosophers whose theories have been so thoroughly superseded. The Aristotelian scholastics were equally wrong about many matters having to do with physics and astronomy, but they did at least think that their theories should be consistent with actual observation, and that definitions and arguments should be offered. It is difficult to enter into a dialogue with pure cosmological speculation, however sympathetic one's approach. Like the Renaissance writers on magic and the occult, its nature philosophers are surely now only of interest to the intellectual historian.

The book is very well produced, with a refreshing (though not complete) absence of typographical errors. It begins with a chronology of events, and ends with brief biographies of Renaissance philosophers. It also has a full bibliography, and a useful index. There are inevitably some minor errors. For instance, the myth that William of Moerbeke translated for Aquinas is given new currency (p. 73), the date of Ockham's death is given as 1349 in place of the now well-established 1347 (p. 258), Ramus is credited with retaining the Aristotelian syllogism, despite his total reformulation of it (p. 17), and the biography of Paul of Venice repeats the old, unsupported claims about exposure to Averroism in Oxford and a visit to Paris (p. 353). Nonetheless, the editor James Hankins is to be congratulated for producing a volume that will undoubtedly stimulate its readers to find out more. While I have made some critical remarks about the organization of topics and a lack of balance, it is difficult to see how Hankins could have done better in the compass of a reasonably sized book which is not aimed at specialists.