The Cambridge Companion to Rousseau

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Riley, Patrick (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Rousseau, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 453 pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-521-57615-6.

Reviewed by Andrew Levine, University of Wisconsin-Madison


In recent decades, Rousseau’s political writings have served as a valuable, and even indispensable, resource for political philosophers working in the analytical tradition (broadly construed). Rousseau’s work bears on many of the deepest questions of modern political philosophy – including, most conspicuously, issues in democratic theory, especially in its participatory and its deliberative versions. Recent reconstructions and defenses of anarchist, Marxist, republican, liberal and even conservative positions in political philosophy have drawn heavily on Rousseau’s work. So too have philosophical investigations of contractarianism and, more generally, of justifying strategies in political philosophy. At a slightly lower level of abstraction, Rousseau’s thinking has been invoked, in one or another way, in contemporary reflections on a panoply of political ideas – including, among others, revolution, totalitarianism, patriotism, political representation, civil society, and civil religion. These concerns do surface, from time to time, in the essays in this collection, but there is hardly any philosophical engagement with them; at least, not of the kind that analytical philosophers would acknowledge. Rousseau has also been a source and a foil for any of a number of recent feminist criticisms of the grand tradition in Western political thought. With the partial exception of two essays on the Émile, one by Geraint Parry and another by Susan Meld Shell, this concern too is seldom in focus in this collection, though these essays – Shell’s, especially – are more recognizably philosophical.

What this Cambridge Companion offers instead of philosophy, as most readers of this review are likely to think of it, are essays in intellectual history – not of the (very rare) magisterial kind that philosophers can draw on to reorient their thinking, nor even of the “contextualist” sort that relates political philosophy to the real (contemporaneous) world of politics. Contextualist histories of political ideas can be enormously useful in helping analytically trained political philosophers correct their tendency (almost a professional deformation) to read the writings of great philosophers like Rousseau as if they were engaged in timeless debates with one another and with philosophers today – and not, as is obviously the case, with their own contemporaries. The focus in this volume, however, is instead on Rousseau’s relation to lesser (but still canonical) figures in the history of political thought – with particular focus on intersecting political and theological controversies in seventeenth and eighteenth century France. That this very traditional concern should be so evident in this collection seems odd, inasmuch as most of the authors appear to have made their peace with those of their colleagues who (ostensibly) disparage all canons. Analytical philosophers who read current intellectual history rarely may be surprised to find old school gentility cheerfully coexisting with post-modern depredations of high-mindedness. But when ideas are treated more as historical artifacts than as items to interrogate, defend, criticize and, where necessary, revise, this unlikely concatenation of positions is possible, and even likely, given prevailing fashions in humanities departments and, evidently, in departments of political science as well.

The essays in this volume that most evidently accord with the stance just described are those by Mark Hulliung, on Rousseau’s relation to Voltaire, Diderot and other Enlightenment figures, and on the lingering influence of Pascal’s religious ideas in Rousseau’s thinking; by Chirstopher Brooke, on Rousseau’s relation to Augustinian and Stoical strains in French theological and political thought; and the two pieces by Patrick Riley on the (largely theological) ancestry of the idea of a “general will,” and on Rousseau’s position(s) in some contemporaneous debates about the pertinence of classical (especially Roman) political ideas. Then, in addition to the two pieces (by Parry and Shell) on the Émile, there are essays by Victor Gourevitch on Rousseau’s reflections on religiosity; by Christopher Kelly on The Confessions, and by C.N. Dugan and Tracy Strong on Rousseau’s views on music and the theater. The essays by Gourevitch and Kelly shed some light on the texts they discuss; the essay by Dugan and Strong joins together, not altogether cogently, what Rousseau says about representation (in the arts) with his views on representative political institutions. This essay is especially flagrant in its reliance on plays on words; but the others too are inclined to conflate words with ideas in ways that are likely to irritate analytically trained philosophers and more fastidious historians of ideas.

This volume also reprints an essay written long ago by Judith Shklar (d. 1992) on La Nouvelle Héloïse, “Rousseau’s Images of Authority”; and an overview of Rousseau’s writings by George Armstrong Kelly (d. 1987). In addition, it includes a translation of a well-known but previously untranslated essay of Jean Starobinski’s, “The Motto Vitam impendere vero and the Question of Lying.” These are not the only exceptions to the rule followed in most Cambridge Companions to print only specially commissioned essays. A number of the other pieces (including one by the editor) have also appeared elsewhere, though only in some of the cases can a discerning reader find this fact acknowledged (in a footnote).

The essays by Kelly, Shklar and Starobinski are weightier than the rest. Readers encountering them for the first time will learn a good deal from them. But perhaps the most interesting piece included in this collection is the one that is the least ostensibly “philosophical” and most self-consciously literary: Thomas Kavanagh’s virtuoso effort to “read” core Rousseauian views out of (what else!) a little known “minor” work, The Levite of Ephraïm. For the philosophically minded reader, working laboriously through this volume and looking in vain for patches of philosophical interest, this skillful exercise in literary criticism, coming almost at the end, can reignite a modicum of interest – not just for doing what it does well, but also for not pretending to be something other than it is. But the sense of relief is short-lived. Robert Wokler’s concluding essay “Ancient Postmodernism in the Philosophy of Rousseau” is perhaps the most self-consciously philosophical piece in the volume. But philosophers who make it that far, even if they are not put off by its “continental” orientation, will find that it resumes with a vengeance that aphilosophical approach to philosophy that runs throughout the entire collection.