The Cambridge Companion to Schleiermacher

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Jacqueline Mariña (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Schleiermacher, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 362pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 052189137X.

Reviewed by Robert B. Louden, University of Southern Maine


The Cambridge Companion to Schleiermacher, a volume in the Cambridge Companions to Religion series, is divided into three parts (I: Schleiermacher as Philosopher, II: Schleiermacher as Theologian, III: Culture, Society, and Religion), and contains sixteen wide-ranging contributions, along with an Introduction, an extensive Schleiermacher bibliography (including both German texts and English translations), and an Index. I will begin this review with a brief descriptive summary of each contribution, move on to some evaluative comments on a few pieces that may be of particular interest to readers of NDPR (or, at least, that are of particular interest to this reviewer), and conclude with some brief evaluative comments about the volume as a whole.

Manfred Frank, in "Metaphysical Foundations: A Look at Schleiermacher's Dialectic," leads off Part I, and begins by announcing that "strictly speaking, Schleiermacher does not have a metaphysics, if by this is meant a foundational philosophical doctrine" (p. 15). Following Plato, Schleiermacher calls his first philosophy "dialectic." However, Schleiermacher's own work entitled Dialectic is in Frank's judgment "the most unmanageable of Schleiermacher's works;" one which, "after 150 years, … remains a riddle," but which is "nonetheless, his foundational philosophical œuvre" (17).

Robert Merrihew Adams, in "Faith and Religious Knowledge," is primarily concerned with Schleiermacher's epistemology of religion and its theological implications. For the most part, he focuses on Schleiermacher's famous claim that the essence of religion consists in "the feeling of absolute dependence" (see, e.g., 37), asking what theological assertions follow from this starting point, and what the epistemic status of these assertions might be.

Frederick C. Beiser, in "Schleiermacher's Ethics," after cautioning that "the very concept, 'Schleiermacher's ethics', is misleading because it suggests that he had a final and complete system, or at least a consistent and characteristic doctrine" (54), surveys the many twists and turns in Schleiermacher's writings on ethics, concluding that ethics should be "recognized as one of the fundamental areas of his philosophical achievement," an achievement that remains "a challenge to ethics today" (70).

Andrew Bowie, in "The Philosophical Significance of Schleiermacher's Hermeneutics," argues that "Schleiermacher's hermeneutics is based precisely on the attempt to get round the dilemmas involved in both structural and intentionalist approaches" to interpreting texts (74). In situating Schleiermacher's hermeneutics outside of this influential dichotomy, Bowie also tries to link his approach to recent developments in American philosophy that are "concerned to sustain intersubjective rationality -- including scientific rationality -- without surrendering truth solely to the natural sciences" (89).

Finally, Julia A. Lamm, in "The Art of Interpreting Plato," concludes Part I with an investigation of philosophical issues relevant both to Schleiermacher's famous German translations of Plato's dialogues as well as to his views about interpreting Plato.

Part II, the longest of the book's three parts, opens with Richard Crouter's "Shaping an Academic Discipline: The Brief Outline on the Study of Theology." Using the Brief Outline as his main text, Crouter is primarily concerned to delineate Schleiermacher's position on the proper relationships between philosophical theology, historical theology, and practical theology. Practical theology, surprisingly, turns out to be theology's crown: "the place where the theologian's gifts yield fruits and exert leadership within the life of a congregation, the larger church body, and the world of human affairs" (123).

Walter E. Wyman, Jr., in "Sin and Redemption," examines Schleiermacher's reinterpretations of these two central concepts in Christianity, concluding with some notes on their possibilities and limitations for contemporary theology (146-47).

Editor Jacqueline Mariña, in "Christology and Anthropology in Friedrich Schleiermacher," discusses Schleiermacher's understanding of both the humanity and divinity of Jesus, as well as their interrelationship, arguing that many contemporary criticisms of Schleiermacher's Christology "are the result of too shallow a reading of him" (168).

Francis Schüssler Fiorenza, in "Schleiermacher's Understanding of God as Triune," seeks both to analyze Schleiermacher's doctrine of the trinity and to defend it against a variety of criticisms past and present.

In their joint contribution, "Providence and Grace: Schleiermacher on Justification and Election," Dawn DeVries and B. A. Gerrish focus on Schleiermacher's reinterpretation of the doctrines of justification and election, arguing that both doctrines need to be understood within the context of his conception of God's providence -- "forming the world into the kingdom of God" (191).

Eilert Herms, in "Schleiermacher's Christian Ethics," seeks to situate Schleiermacher's Christian Ethics within "the context of human understanding as a whole" (209), concluding that while some of Schleiermacher's statements in this area "are no longer valid today," others remain "relevant to us" at present and that it is "our duty to engage and take a position vis-à-vis" the latter (228).

Christine Helmer, in "Schleiermacher's Exegetical Theology and the New Testament," brings Part II of the Companion to a close by examining various aspects of Schleiermacher's New Testament scholarship. While admitting that this area of Schleiermacher's work has "enjoyed relatively little scholarly attention" (229), she argues that his efforts here "remain landmarks in theology" -- landmarks "whose impact still creates the continuity of Christian self-consciousness through to the present day" (245).

David E. Klemm, in "Culture, Arts, and Religion," leads off the final part of the volume with an investigation into how Schleiermacher thinks religion should relate to culture, using Schleiermacher's famous early work, On Religion: Speeches to its Cultured Despisers (1799), as his point of departure.

Theodore Vial, in "Schleiermacher and the State," examines Schleiermacher's position that states "are the organic expression of a people's highest strivings" (277), concluding that "the world needs each nation to develop in its own way," and that each national community plays a unique role "in the providential unfolding of history" (283).

Thandeka, in "Schleiermacher, Feminism, and Liberation Theologies: A Key," argues that the key in question is Schleiermacher's doctrine of the soul; specifically, his view that each person's original gender "is neither male nor female nor androgynous" (293), and which Schleiermacher himself simply named the "artist" (292).

Finally, Terrence N. Tice, in "Schleiermacher Yesterday, Today, and Tomorrow," brings the volume to a close with an overview of "the history of Schleiermacher reception in English-speaking domains" (309), along with some judgments about current gaps in the understanding of both Schleiermacher's philosophy and theology.

As the above summary indicates, the essays in this Companion cover a lot of territory. While highly appropriate for a book dealing with Schleiermacher's thought, I suspect that many if not most readers will naturally gravitate toward one or another of the volume's three parts, perhaps never venturing outside of its disciplinary boundaries. While it is not possible to seriously evaluate all aspects of this wide-ranging book in a short review, I would now like to offer an evaluation of at least a few key aspects of it.

Schleiermacher's philosophical ethics has received increased attention in recent years. We now have English translations of much of his work in this area, and English-speaking philosophers and theologians, though far from matching the output of their German colleagues, have also begun to write more about this central area of his thought. Beiser, in his contribution to the volume, does a masterful job both in surveying the development of Schleiermacher's ethical thought over the course of his career and in summarizing his key commitments at each stage. But his concluding chastisement of the "dreary" state of contemporary ethics, and his prediction that the situation could be rectified if only moral philosophers would listen to "powerful voices like" Schleiermacher's (70), fails to convince for at least two reasons. First, as we saw earlier, Beiser himself recognizes that Schleiermacher "never finished his system" of ethics; he had no "final and complete system" of ethics or even a "consistent" one (54). Because Schleiermacher's early ethical views are not always consistent with his later views, those readers who are enamored of his ethical views during, say, the early Berlin years (1796-1802) are likely to be repelled by some of his later views. So one needs to decide which Schleiermacher one is referring to when one encourages others to listen to his powerful voice. Second, Beiser's closing emphasis on Schleiermacher's "comprehensive conception of ethics" (70) strongly suggests that it is indeed the later ethics that he has in mind. But if this is the case, much more argument is needed to show that this particular ethical outlook is what contemporary ethics needs. For as Beiser himself also notes, two favorite claims from Schleiermacher's later ethics are that "ethics is history" and that "ethics should not be understood as a normative science" (68). It is far from obvious how adding these two paradoxical claims to the contemporary mix of ethical theory -- if indeed participants could ever be persuaded to do so -- would improve things.

Schleiermacher's groundbreaking early work, On Religion: Speeches to its Cultured Despisers, is perhaps the one text with which philosopher and theologian alike -- indeed, all readers who profess an interest in Schleiermacher -- are familiar, and Klemm's essay focuses on this central text more than any other contribution to the volume. In his discussion, Klemm rashly rejects the widely-shared view that Schleiermacher is a stern opponent of natural religion, asserting instead that "there is an element of affirmation in Schleiermacher's critique of natural religion" and that "Schleiermacher's own articulation of the essence of religion participates in the project of natural religion to articulate the common, necessary structure of the historical religions" (259). Klemm is of course correct in claiming that part of Schleiermacher's goal in On Religion is to articulate the essence of religion. But this hardly makes Schleiermacher a participant in the project of natural religion. Indeed, if all that one needs in order to be counted as a participant in the project of natural religion is an attempt to articulate the essence of religion, then anyone and everyone who has ever attempted to define religion in this manner suddenly becomes a member of the Natural Religion Club -- whether they have willingly applied for membership or not.

Editor Mariña concludes her Introduction by noting that "Schleiermacher was such a polymath, and his thought so rich [,] that no single volume can do justice to his work" (10). I think this is true, but -- in an era when most philosophers and theologians have not only long stopped talking to each other, but where the myriad specializations within both disciplines also severely impede contemporary scholars of either persuasion from understanding the scope and depth of Schleiermacher's work -- the present volume probably comes as close as we are likely to get in reaching this goal. Not every aspect of Schleiermacher's thought is covered in the present anthology (e. g., his participation in both the founding of the University of Berlin and in the struggle of German Jewry to gain full citizenship and civic equality receive nary a mention), and at times some of the contributors appear to be at cross-purposes with each other (e.g., in what they say about Schleiermacher's debts to Spinoza, as well as his relationship to liberal theology generally). But The Cambridge Companion to Schleiermacher is nevertheless the best single-volume discussion in English of Schleiermacher's thought with which I am familiar.