The Cambridge Companion to Science and Religion

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Peter Harrison (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Science and Religion, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 307pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521712514.

Reviewed by James Kellenberger, California State University, Northridge


In 1939 the philosopher C. D. Broad remarked that discussions of the relations between religion and science had "acquired something of the repulsiveness of half-cold mutton in half-congealed gravy." So Peter Harrison observes in the gambit that begins this book. Fortunately, Harrison reflects, things have changed in the study of science and religion: there is much new substance. The fourteen essays in this collection are far from "half-congealed" in their treatment of that new substance.

A main effort of several of the volume's authors is to show that the "conflict myth" is just that, a myth. They argue that science and religion are not necessarily in conflict and, historically, they often have not been. Rather, there was a complex relation between science and religion in the first fifteen hundred years of the Common Era and beyond, a relation sometimes marked by opposition, sometimes by acceptance and support of science by religion. As this book makes clear, this complex relationship persisted through Darwin's century up to the present day.

Opposition to the "classical sciences" was registered by Tertullian around the beginning of the third century. Later an opposition to science was seemingly expressed by the Roman Church's treatment of Giordano Bruno and Galileo Galilei (although in Galileo's case the Aristotelian viewpoint of his own scientific community was also opposed to his novel theories). The medieval church, however, guided by the Augustinian idea that the pagan natural sciences were to be the handmaiden of the church, was supportive of natural philosophy or science. From the twelfth century the church was the patron of the newly emerging universities in places such as Bologna, Paris, and Oxford, where theology coexisted with natural science despite some tensions and thousands of students studied the natural sciences. Another aspect of the relation (or relations) between religion and science in the medieval period was a certain division of labor. Natural philosophy was concerned with explaining natural phenomena in terms of naturalistic "secondary causes" without invoking God in its explanations, always under the assumption that God was the primary cause working though secondary causes. This carved out a proper area for natural philosophy that the theologians were happy to concede. Before and after Galileo, though the church and its Inquisition were concerned about teachings deemed adverse to church authority, most often critical attention was directed toward the work of theologians, not that of natural philosophers or scientists.

Although the contributors to this volume do not explicitly say so, the issue between religion and science is continuous with the issue between faith and reason, or that between Jerusalem and Athens, as Tertullian put it. Aquinas' resolution of the faith-reason issue was to show that the two were never in conflict. The preambles to faith, such as the existence of God, could be accepted on faith, as they were by most, or proven by systematic and rigorous argumentation, open to the capable, which for them yielded scientia or "scientific knowledge" of the preambles.

The medieval concern with heresy was later replaced with the modern concern with secularization. In his essay, John Hedley Brooke examines the connection between the growth of science and the growth of secularization. He argues that there is no single process of secularization that can be ascribed to science or to any other factor in isolation. Drawing upon the work of Charles Taylor, Brooke brings into relief the importance of a shift of "moral outlook," which retrospectively gives importance to science as a reason for turning from religious belief. In this "alternative morality" there are new values, such as a greater emphasis on personal liberty along with a sense that -- in contrast with the Middles Ages -- religious faith is only one option among others. Perhaps an instance of this kind of moral shift is seen in the way curiosity was regarded for centuries and the way it is now regarded. For Tertullian its purpose was vain and for Augustine it was a disease, an attitude that persisted into the medieval period. In the modern period, correlating with the growth and social acceptance of science, curiosity is closer to being a virtue than a vice.

The Companion has three parts: "Historical Interactions," "Religion and Contemporary Science," and "Philosophical Perspectives." Several essays in the first two parts deal with Darwin or reactions to his theory of evolutuion. In the decades before the publication of On the Origin of Species it was generally felt by both theologians and scientists in the United States and Great Britain that the more that is known about the variety and plenitude in the biological world, the more there is fostered an appreciation for God's bounty and wisdom. Professors of botany and geology were also ministers of the church. Indeed, initially many natural scientists rejected Darwin's evolutionary theory, as they had rejected earlier evolutionary theories. Their reaction encouraged similar responses among some, but not all, religious thinkers. John Henry Newman notably found nothing in Darwin's work that contradicted either revelation or belief in God.

Darwin himself was loath to enter the lists in defense of his theory, but T. H. Huxley was not and took up the cudgels in debate. As Huxley came to appreciate, Darwin's theory was not well understood. When Bishop Wilberforce asked him if he was descended from a monkey on his grandfather's or his grandmother's side he betrayed a serious misunderstanding of Darwin's theory, according to which no contemporary species has evolved from any other contemporary species. Darwin's theory did, however, contradict a literal reading of the Genesis story of creation according to which all biological species were created at once about 5000 years ago. Nevertheless, at a deeper level, Huxley thought, "the antagonism between science and religion" was "purely factitious." True, he understood the strength of "Jewish and Christian scriptures" to be not in doctrinal truth, but in their appeal to "the ethical sense." Huxley saw that ethical sense, with its demand for self-restraint and giving help to one's fellows, as antithetical to biological evolution. Thus, for Huxley, Darwin's evolutionary theory was factual and true but left in place the need for religion as he understood it.

A second major scientific advance (a twentieth-century development in physics) that is in real or seeming conflict with religion is Big Bang theory. Much astronomical and physical evidence indicates that the universe is about 13.7 billion years old and was produced by a physical process called the "Big Bang," after which the universe has been expanding and cooling for nearly fourteen billion years. In his contribution, William R. Stoeger, a Jesuit priest and a cosmologist, discusses such questions as "Did God as creator trigger the Big Bang?" and "With the prospect that physics and cosmology might be able to provide a detailed account of the origin of the universe, is there really any need for God -- for a creator?"

Stoeger argues that cosmology and theology are "complementary." He reasons that only physics, and not theology, can provide a physical explanation of the universe, but only theology, and not physics, can offer an account of the "ultimate source of existence and order." One can always ask of the event or process postulated in a physical account, including the Big Bang: What caused it? And finally the end answer must be metaphysical, not physical, which is to say in the province of theology and religion. This argument is cogent. However, one is reminded of the debate (unmentioned by Stoeger) between F. C. Copleston and Bertrand Russell. Copleston, a Jesuit like Stoeger, held that one can ask of the entirety of things in the whole universe, on what does it depend, what is its cause? Russell, perhaps sensing the character such an explanation must have, argued that a question of that sort lacked meaning. Dividing the two was religious sensibility, present in the one and absent in the other.

The volume also contains essays that provide detailed narratives of the efforts of religious groups in the public arena to prevail against received scientific views or to interact with science in an effort to influence social attitudes on ethical issues. Ronald L. Numbers cites the forming and waning of several antievolutionary groups, legal actions relating to their claims, popular opinion polls, and even comments by political figures. He gives a blow-by-blow description of the twentieth-century attempt by antievolutionary and religiously conservative groups first to establish as a scientifically respectable alternative to evolutionary theory "flood geology," which came to be known as "young-earth creationism," and then later "scientific creationism." According to these groups, Genesis, including the biblical story of the flood and Noah's ark, was to be read literally.

Numbers traces how a number of American scientists from the 1930s to the 1960s formed associations that were antievolutionary or creationist. Scientific creationism, coming to prominence in the 1960s and 70s, differed from the older flood geology in omitting mention of biblical persons and events such as Adam and Eve and Noah's flood, but the role of the "Genesis flood" remained the same. Some scientific creationists had scientific training at the Ph.D. level, and scientific creationists protested their commitment to science. However, their efforts to have scientific creationism accepted in public school curricula as a scientific alternative to evolutionary theory were squelched by legal rulings in the 1980s. The "intelligent design" movements (ID), begun in the early 1990s, was also presented as a scientific alternative to evolutionary theory, and it too, in a 2005 court ruling, was rebuked in its claim to be science.

Nevertheless, although Numbers does not make this observation, the intelligent design issue, like the issue over ID's progenitor, the design argument championed by William Paley in the early nineteenth century, remains an intellectual issue, if not a scientific one. The logical credentials of the design or teleological argument are regularly assessed in innumerable contemporary philosophy of religion courses.

John H. Evans provides a similarly detailed description of the struggle of religion with science over bioethics or, rather, of religion's struggle to hold its position of authority on ethical issues that arose from advances in science and medical technology in the last half of the twentieth century. These include the discovery of DNA, the use of respirators, heart transplants, in vitro fertilization, and cloning. Evans treats primarily "public bioethics," where, he observes, the interaction between religion and science is mostly found. His narrative includes such influential figures as Paul Ramsey, the Methodist theologian, along with the philosopher Tom L. Beauchamp and the theologian James Childers who together published Principles of Biomedical Ethics (1979), a text that has defined much of the discussion in bioethics. Evans' narrative discusses events such as bioethical conferences held in the 1960s. These conferences, which at first were attended only by scientists, had theologians increasingly in attendance over time. Evans also discusses the government's role, not limiting himself to the judiciary (as Numbers does), but exploring as well the role of the executive branch. He considers for example, a national commission (in existence during both the Clinton and Bush administrations) that heard testimony on cloning, which in different ways reflected public pressure from the religious right during the period.

The religious focus of the book is nearly exclusively on Christianity. Harrison concedes this, justifying it in part on the grounds that modern science developed in the Christian West, a point that Michael Ruse repeats to justify his focus on Christianity in his essay on atheism, naturalism, and science. While it may be true that science developed in the West in a Christian era, in today's world all the major religions exist alongside science (the Dalai Lama has for some years engaged in dialogue with groups of scientists). If some religions do not react to or feel confronted by science -- as may be the case with various forms of Hinduism -- this in itself is a significant piece in the mosaic of the relationship between religion and science.

Islam and Judaism are touched upon briefly, once each in their reactions to Darwinism and once or twice more. Much more could have been said about contemporary Jewish responses to science. Attention could have been paid to the effort of Daniel C. Matt to relate the Big Bang to the categories of Kabbalah. Or, in the area of bioethics, there could have been consideration of Elliot N. Dorff's and Aaron L. Mackler's work on the methodological roles of case versus principles in contemporary Jewish medical ethics and bioethics.

Besides Islam and Judaism, the only other religion explicitly mentioned is Buddhism. In the book's last essay, Makael Stenmark, looks at different models that might be used to aid in understanding the relation between science and religion. He presents a typology of different models for the relation between them -- irreconcilability, reconciliation, independence, and replacement -- along with variations of the reconciliation model. Stenmark considers not only the Western theistic religions but also the nontheistic religions of the East. He brings out how the perception that science and religion are in conflict is not sufficient for the irreconcilability view, for it could still be allowed that the conflict might be resolved. Stenmark also observes that though science and Christianity might be judged irreconcilable on certain grounds (see, for example, Richard Dawkins) those same grounds might not make science and Buddhism irreconcilable.

In its historical, sociological, and conceptual dimensions this is a valuable book. One minor blemish is the index. It is far from complete: not every mention of Thomas Aquinas or Newton is listed, and there is no entry for Bruno or pantheism, among other omissions. The volume is meant to be an introduction, and it is that. Often, although not invariably, specialized or technical terms are explained. All the essays are clearly written. The book as a whole will be of use not only to non-specialists but also to specialists in philosophy, comparative studies, and religious studies seeking either a wider understanding of the issues covered or an enhancement of their formulation.