The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza's Ethics

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Olli Koistinen (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza's Ethics, Cambridge UP, 2009, 323pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521618601.

Reviewed by Syliane Malinowski-Charles, Bishop's University, Canada



This new Companion is in no way intended to replace the 1996 Cambridge Companion to Spinoza edited by Don Garrett. Rather, it is meant to complement it by providing more focused analyses of Spinoza’s magnum opus at a time in which Spinoza studies have known a formidable explosion everywhere in the world, and particularly in North America during the last five years. Whereas the first Cambridge Companion covered many aspects of Spinoza’s philosophy generally, this one offers analyses that will be useful to anyone teaching Spinoza’s Ethics properly speaking, or to anyone trying to understand better the theories that Spinoza presented in it. Beyond only three articles referring mostly to the Ethics, specifically those devoted to Spinoza’s metaphysics, to his theory of knowledge, and to his ethical theory, the reader of the first Companion also had the opportunity to learn about Spinoza’s life and reception, his natural science, and his theology and biblical scholarship — among other things. Here, by contrast, the articles follow the order of the Ethics and treat, one after the other and in depth, the main concepts that Spinoza put forth in the book in which he enclosed all his wisdom. In a nutshell, this is a much-needed Companion coming at a time when a growing number of English-speaking scholars have started to include a study of the Ethics in their classrooms, and have themselves been struggling with the difficulties of Spinoza’s thought. It will provide conceptual tools as much for the more advanced as for the beginner in the study of this difficult but fascinating philosophy.

Something particularly interesting about this book is the list of contributors, which includes a number of younger and very promising Spinoza scholars (e.g., Michael LeBuffe, Valtteri Viljanen, and Andrew Youpa), while also benefiting from the experience of more established academics such as Piet Steenbakkers, Susan James, and Don Garrett. This gives some fresh voices to the well-trodden themes already studied by older or more recognized contributors such as those who were included in the 1996 Companion to Spinoza, who had written the first important books on Spinoza at the time of the renewal of interest in his work in that decade as well as at the end of the preceding one — crucial scholars such as Jonathan Bennett, Margaret Wilson, Alan Donogan, Edwin Curley, Richard Popkin, or Pierre-François Moreau. While their contributions remain jewels and a continued source of inspiration and knowledge for all Spinoza scholars, it is nice to see that some new names are being made known to readers. The choice of contributors is limited, of course, and many very valuable persons are left out, but it is an interesting start to a rather unusual practice for the Cambridge Companions.

A twenty-five page introduction by Valtteri Viljanen and Olli Koistinen, the editor of the volume, gives a summary of the progression of the Ethics by explaining its main theories according to the order in which the different parts of Spinoza’s book introduce them. This introduction does not contain anything more, but it is finely written and the explanations are clear. It may be useful for those readers who will be newcomers to Spinoza’s thought, or those who will have read him in part only, in that it allows them to have a survey of the whole book clearly in mind before getting to a more detailed study.

The two first articles, written by the Dutch Spinoza scholar Piet Steenbakkers, offer an account of "The Textual History of Spinoza’s Ethics" — a topic on which Steenbakkers is one of the most important contemporary authorities — and of "The Geometrical Order in the Ethics." It makes sense to have started with these topics because they constitute a prerequisite to any avenue of encounter with the Ethics. Steenbakkers, who holds the endowed chair of Spinoza studies at Erasmus University in Rotterdam, is also well known for his work in establishing the text of Spinoza’s Ethics with the Groupe de recherches spinozistes in France, which led him to the publication of Spinoza’s Ethica from Manuscript to Print: Studies on Text, Form and Related Topics (Van Gorcum/Utrecht University, Assen/Utrecht, 1994). His first article in this new Companion takes stock of the current scholarship on the history of the Ethics. Not only does Steenbakkers offer a study of the differences between the Short Treatise and the Ethics in order to understand the filiation between the two texts, he also explains the circumstances surrounding the publication of the Ethics in the Opera Posthuma in 1677, and gives a critical survey of its major translations up to the present times. This article is a much-needed tool whose inclusion in this volume is very welcome, and for which no one better than Steenbakkers could have been found.

Steenbakkers’ second article deals with the geometrical order not just in the Ethics, as the title indicates, but also in Spinoza’s works in general, notably in his presentation of Descartes’ Principles of Philosophy and "in two short annexes: an enclosure to Ep2 … and the first of the two appendices to the Short Treatise" (49). The reader is provided with a somewhat short but interesting analysis of Spinoza’s method, as well as of the role that Euclidian principles and mathematics held for him.

The third chapter of this Companion, written by Valtteri Viljanen, is devoted to “Spinoza’s Ontology,” and thus plunges us into the depths of the first part of the Ethics. Giving an account of “Substance and Mode” and of “Existence and Causality,” Viljanen explains the basic ideas of Spinoza’s conception of God as Nature, and he discusses some answers given within the analytic tradition to such classical problems as the apparent idealism or subjectivism of the substance-to-attribute relationship, or the differences between modes within the unique substance. Rather than a simple explanation, his article thus aims at providing the reader with a critical assessment of the validity of Spinoza’s arguments in the first part of the Ethics.

Andreas Schmidt’s article on “Substance Monism and Identity Theory in Spinoza,” (Chapter 4) comes back to the debated question of the apparent incompatibility between Spinoza’s substance monism and the multiplicity of the attributes, which are simultaneously formally distinct and ontologically identical with each other. Schmidt suggests that the distinction between substance and attribute should be understood in the same terms as Duns Scotus’ formal distinction, which leads him to a revisitation of Spinoza’s mind-body theory that should be appealing to many readers of Spinoza.

Chapter 5 briefly leaves the field of the textual study of the Ethics in order to focus on a comparison between “Spinoza and the Stoics on Substance Monism.” The similarities between the two systems are often pointed out, and their comparison often provides a first basis to the understanding of one of Spinoza’s most inscrutable conceptions, namely, his compatibilism — i.e., that some sort of human freedom may be compatible with God’s absolute determinism. This, though, is not the topic of the inquiry. Rather, Jon Miller here provides us with a “fine-grained analysis” of both the Stoics’ and Spinoza’s conceptions that there is only one substance (100). In his article, he argues that “Spinoza’s substance monism is similar to but not identical with that of the Stoics” (id.). One of the main differences which he finds between the two is that, for all their similarities,

Spinoza’s method is thoroughly nomological. Now, the status of laws of nature in Stoicism is contested, but on one of the two prevailing views, they neither conceptualized laws of nature in terms remotely similar to Spinoza nor applied the laws in a manner at all reminiscent to how Spinoza applied them (111).

A further study of their arguments for substance monism, which occupies the last section, also confirms the divide between the two systems.

Charles Jarrett, who is well known, among other things, for his articles on mind-body unity, the relativity of good and evil, and the denial of teleology in Spinoza, and who is also the author of Spinoza: A Guide for the Perplexed (Continuum 2007), was a choice candidate for the next chapter, devoted to “Spinoza on Necessity.” His treatment of it is very remote from what one’s expectations of it might be, however. Using formal logic, Jarrett analyses the arguments given in the Short Treatise I,6, and in Ethics I P33 and dem., and he utilizes some of Spinoza’s other formulations (including one from the Metaphysical Thoughts) in order to assess the consistency and validity of Spinoza’s claims. A comparison with Gödel’s ontological argument is even provided, showing that in both cases, “whatever is so is necessarily so” (139). This article clearly stands out because of its logical formalism, and notwithstanding its intrinsic value, its inclusion in a volume intended in great part for the non-specialist reader of philosophy looks inappropriate.

After these four chapters devoted to substance monism and its consequences, the volume makes a more than welcome move to the second part of the Ethics, to which only one article, that of Diana Steinberg, is entirely devoted. Fortunately, her article on "Knowledge in Spinoza’s Ethics" (140-66) is a jewel, and a model of its kind. Steinberg covers the main aspects of Spinoza’s theory of knowledge in a style that is both explicit and clear while remaining fairly concise, something especially appreciable given the breadth of her scope and the difficulty of her topic. She explains how the human mind is nothing but the idea of the human body, and how the imaginative faculties naturally follow from this ontological status. This also leads her to a discussion of “the implausibility of the claim of 2P12 that the human mind perceives everything that happens in the body,” a problem which tends to give rise to confusion when Spinoza’s view is taught to students (143). Steinberg then continues with the distinction between the different kinds of knowledge, the originality of Spinoza’s theory vis-à-vis Cartesian epistemology, and ends with an interesting explanation of the intrinsic strength of ideas, which plays a crucial role in her final explanation of belief and error.

Chapter 8 by Olli Koistinen, “Spinoza on Action,” comes back to the epistemological theories introduced in Ethics II, but it utilizes them in order to give an account of the difference between activity and passivity in Spinoza that moves beyond epistemology properly speaking. Indeed, Koistinen makes clear that activity can only be found within adequate knowledge, and he explains why, but he also integrates this discussion in a direction that announces the subsequent chapters on freedom.

In a long chapter entitled “The Anatomy of the Passions” (188-222), which turns out to be the only one devoted to Ethics III, LeBuffe starts by presenting the conatus theory and then links it with a more general account of the passions. This chapter then moves to a detailed explanation of the deduction of all the affects from the three primary ones: desire, joy and sadness. To this end, LeBuffe provides the reader with a very useful table cataloguing the main passions in English and in Latin — a table that is, to my knowledge, the unique English equivalent for a resource that was otherwise available primarily to French readers in Pierre Macherey’s book-length study of Ethics III (Introduction à l’Éthique de Spinoza. La troisième partie: la réalité affective, Paris: PUF, 1995). This is only one of the many stand-out qualities of this chapter, which is also remarkably well written and very clear. I personally regret, however, that its explicit focus was reduced to the passions, because this led LeBuffe to pay little attention to the affects generally. For instance, this take on the topic prevented him from discussing the active affects which are introduced in the two last propositions of E III, and which are crucial to understanding the progress in knowledge that constitutes the ultimate goal of Spinoza’s ethical endeavor. A discussion of the difference between the two definitions of the affects provided by Spinoza (in E IIIDef3 and in the General Definition of the Affects at the end of the same part) would also have been welcome. Perhaps another chapter could have been devoted to the active affects and their role in the attainment of beatitude, but this Cambridge Companion seems to have succumbed to the traditional bias of not paying sufficient attention to the affects in Spinoza, a tendency reflected in the English literature in general. At the very least, LeBuffe’s article makes an excellent undertaking in giving some place to Ethics III.

This lack might have been covered by Susan James’ article on “Freedom, Slavery, and the Passions,” but this contribution does not repeat the analyses on Spinoza presented in her captivating book, Passion and Action: The Emotions in Seventeenth-Century Philosophy (Oxford: OUP, 1997). Rather, it primarily focuses on the political aspects of Ethics IV, and only then aims at linking Spinoza’s views of political slavery and freedom with a more general account of freedom.

As it turns out, the reader will have to wait until Chapter 12 in order to see the affects’ active role toward wisdom properly explained. Chapter 11, by Andrew Youpa, covers another very interesting aspect of Ethics IV, namely, “Spinoza’s Theory of the Good.” After recalling that, for Spinoza, the good is what is useful (according, among other assertions, to E IVdef1), Youpa tries to determine what “the ultimate end or purpose by which to measure the utility of things” is (242). He studies self-preservation, understanding, and activity as possible candidates for this measure which is also understood to be the summum bonum, and he parts from the idea that Spinoza would be strictly Hobbesian on this issue: “There is therefore more to a striving-to-persevere-in-being than merely striving to prolong the duration of its own psychological existence” (246). This leads him to the conclusion that “Just as reason constitutes the mind’s existence, activity constitutes the body’s. The good life encompasses both,” by which he means that each of the three candidates mentioned above needs the other two in order to constitute the summum bonum (248). This interpretation is further confirmed by a study of the relationship between perseverance and duration on the one hand, and perseverance and eternity on the other. Needless to say, we only have one aspect of Spinoza’s theory of the good in this article — although a crucial one — namely, his theory of the supreme good. One may regret that little, if nothing, is said of the problem of reconciling the Ethics’ apparently relativistic theory of the good with the presentation in Ethics IV of a “model of human nature” and of a good that is universal, a problem often encountered in class discussions.

Finally, the last two chapters deal with the fifth part of the Ethics, devoted to freedom and the advent of the sage. Martin Lin’s Chapter 12, “The Power of Reason in Spinoza,” offers seminal analyses of the transition from Ethics IV to V through the power of the active affects over the more passive ones. This leads Lin to recall the difference between inadequate and adequate ideas, and to elaborate on the different strategies proposed more or less explicitly by Spinoza in the Ethics: 1) to understand the nature of the affects, 2) to separate them from the thought of an external cause, 3) to augment the number of one’s adequate ideas over the inadequate ones, 4) to link a greater number of ideas to universal causes or common properties, 5) to connect one’s bodily affections (Lin here has “affects,” which is not Spinoza’s term in E VP10S, but remains fair to his thought) according to the order of the intellect, and 6) to understand things as necessary. These steps, as is rightly shown, are not to be understood as fundamentally distinct, but rather stand in a continuum which is simply that of rational progress. In sum, this article is a much-needed contribution to the understanding of how exactly Ethics V finally can come to speak of wisdom and beatitude, a leap too often left unexplained that thus appears somewhat mysterious in the traditional studies of Spinoza.

The last chapter, by Don Garrett, focuses on the thorny question of “Spinoza on the Essence of the Human Body and the Part of the Mind that is Eternal,” which occupies Propositions 21 to 42 of the Ethics. One chapter is not much for covering such a difficult (and debated) part of Spinoza’s ethical theory. Garrett’s treatment of it, however, proves to be particularly effective. Far from admitting, like many others, any sort of misunderstanding of the concept of the eternity of the mind, Garrett aims to show that it becomes consistent and clear once one remembers what “formal essence” means, since it is the key to understanding why there is in God an idea of the formal essence of each human body (E VP21). Once this is achieved, the distinction between the differing degrees of minds is also made straightforward thanks to the key concept of consciousness, which represents the final word of the Ethics. As Garrett says,

Rocks, trees, animals, and humans can differ in the extent to which the greater parts of their minds are eternal, then, because they conceive the formal essences of their bodies more or less fully with greater or lesser power of thinking - that is, consciousness (300)

- a conclusion the like of which I can only applaud, as it corroborates the interpretation I developed in my own book on Spinoza (see Affects et conscience chez Spinoza, Hildesheim / New York: Olms, 2004). It may be hard for me to be critical of this chapter, for this reason, but I have no doubts that all readers will agree with me concerning its fantastic explanatory power and its clarity. Finally, this last chapter is followed by a useful index nominum and a bibliography.

All in all, this volume will very well deserve its place in all university libraries and on the shelves of the bookcases of all professors who will ever have to teach Spinoza. It has certain shortcomings, but these, on the whole, reflect the shortcomings of the English literature on Spinoza. These are, notably, an excessive emphasis on the study of Spinoza’s ontology, to the detriment of his theory of the affects which continues to be relegated to a secondary plane, not to say an accessory role. The contributors to this volume also almost systematically ignore everything written in other languages than English (except for the Europeans, in particular Steenbakkers). But this volume also leaves an interesting place for Ethics IV, and despite the very small number of chapters dealing with the last part of the Ethics (i.e, the last two ones), it gives an excellent survey — and an oftentimes original analysis — of its main themes. It remains that Steven Nadler’s recent introductory book on the Ethics at Cambridge University Press (Spinoza’s Ethics: An Introduction, 2006), for instance, is an excellent presentation of this difficult work of the Dutch philosopher, and that many other new books can also be very valuable sources to this end (one may think about Jarrett’s or Della Rocca’s books). It is probably only better for the Spinoza studies that the main publishers compete in offering these new tools, and it is to be hoped that such additional knowledge will contribute to making the readers wiser, as Spinoza would surely have wished.