The Cambridge Companion to Utilitarianism

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Ben Eggleston and Dale E. Miller (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Utilitarianism, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 387pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107656710.

Reviewed by Bart Schultz, University of Chicago


Given the long and intimate association between utilitarianism and Cambridge University, which has housed such giants as William Paley, Henry Sidgwick, and G. E. Moore, a Cambridge Companion to Utilitarianism might seem long overdue. But perhaps the appearance of this volume is in the end timely, since after being pronounced dead at regular intervals over the course of the twentieth century, utilitarianism is now enjoying a renaissance that promises to be of enduring significance. Such recent volumes as Derek Parfit's On What Matters (Oxford, 2011) and Katarzyna de Lazari-Radek's and Peter Singer's The Point of View of the Universe: Sidgwick and Contemporary Ethics (Oxford, 2014) have brilliantly defended many of the positions set out by Sidgwick in his masterwork The Methods of Ethics (first edition 1874), widely and rightly regarded as the high point of classical utilitarianism, albeit a high point that was at some distance from the naturalism of Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill. These works and many others make it much more difficult to claim that utilitarianism is merely the simplistic backdrop against which the better alternatives of ethical and political theory can be defined. To adapt a line from the elderly Bentham, utilitarians are now philosophizing "like dragons."

The Cambridge Companion to Utilitarianism is in many respects a lovely introduction to utilitarianism in many of its rich and varied forms. The editors and the contributors work hard to give a balanced and sympathetic portrayal of major figures in and varieties of utilitarianism, "the moral theory based on the maximization of overall well-being" (1), and the work is happily less than indulgent of the asinine cheap shots that pervade introductory works and courses on ethics. The fine contribution by Henry West on John Stuart Mill (a perennial object of the cheapest of shots) is illustrative:

Mill's psychology may be mistaken, but there is now a growing consensus that in his 'proof' the author of A System of Logic is not committing elementary logical fallacies unworthy of a logician. He is appealing to psychological evidence to move from facts of pleasure and pain and of desires and aversions to judgments of good and bad as ends of action. (76)

Much the same goes for other elements of Mill's views (e.g., on the quality of pleasures) that have regularly been used to instruct young philosophy students in the fine art of mangling rather than carefully reading a text.

In fact, the first four chapters -- Colin Heydt on "Utilitarianism before Bentham," James Crimmins on "Bentham and utilitarianism in the early nineteenth century," West on "Mill and utilitarianism in the mid-nineteenth century," and Roger Crisp on "Sidgwick and utilitarianism in the late nineteenth century" -- do such a splendid job of portraying early and classical utilitarianism in compelling terms that the following chapter by Krister Bykvist on "Utilitarianism in the twentieth century" has a difficult time making it appear that the "greater precision" (103) of twentieth-century work on utilitarianism was actually in the end all that important, especially since the work even of such sophisticated theorists as John Harsanyi and R. M. Hare, on whom he focuses, now seems much more deeply problematic than Sidgwick's work (see de Lazari-Radek and Singer, The Point of View of the Universe). And as Crisp's excellent contribution demonstrates (at least by implication), Sidgwick's cognitive intuitionism or rationalism, and his hedonism, are in far better health than the crude positivistic and economistic forms of twentieth century utilitarianism, which were so dogmatically opposed to interpersonal comparisons of utility, cardinality, hedonism, and so forth, that they were, in Martha Nussbaum's words, but a "severed limb" of classical utilitarianism (see her Philosophical Interventions: Reviews 1986-2011, Oxford, 2012, chap. 24). Crisp himself is a distinguished defender of the cogency of the hedonistic alternative (see his Reasons and the Good, Oxford, 2006, chap. 4).

Special note should also be made here of Crimmins's fascinating piece on Bentham, which, more than any other contribution to this volume, brings in the larger historical and global context, along with many relatively (or completely) uncelebrated figures in the history of utilitarianism. This is, to be sure, especially appropriate when discussing Bentham, given the vagaries of Bentham's reputation in England and his astonishing influence abroad, thanks in no small part to Pierre-Étienne-Louis Dumont's translating and editing, which produced the Traités de législation civile et pénale (1802) and other works. Bentham's success owed much to Dumont:

Dumont records that 3,000 copies of the Traités were initially distributed in France, and that it was 'frequently quoted in many official compositions relating to civil or criminal codes.' Soon after, it was translated into Russian, and later into Spanish, German, Hungarian, Polish, and Portuguese. Other editions of the Traités followed. Reportedly, 50,000 copies of Dumont's various recensions were sold in Europe in the early decades of the century and 40,000 in Spanish translation in Latin America alone. (45).

Bentham's devoted foreign followers included such figures as Francisco de Paula Santander, Vice President of Gran Colombia, Pedro Alcántara de Somellera, a law professor at the University of Buenos Aires, and, in the U.S., "the historian and anti-slave propagandist Richard Hildreth" (47). He corresponded with everyone from Tsar Alexander to James Madison, John Quincy Adams, and Andrew Jackson. In fact, as Crimmins has shown in this and other works, the influence of Bentham in the U.S. was far more important than is commonly recognized, with such popular periodicals as The Diamond and The Yankee proclaiming on their banners "the greatest happiness for the greatest number." For all the recognition of the practical reform work of the classical utilitarians, the Philosophical Radicals, as the Benthamites were called, a genuine "People's History" of utilitarianism from a global perspective has yet to be written. And even Crimmins fails to discuss the important role played by Aaron Burr, influential friend to both Bentham and Godwin (who is also absent from this volume).

The historical richness of Crimmins's account is matched by his acute analysis of Bentham's actual arguments. Thus, he notes that

Clearly, Bentham was aware of the limitations of the mathematical approach to summing pleasures and pains. As recent scholars have noted, his classification of pleasures included qualitative distinctions not amenable to strict calculation. It is impossible, for example, to quantify the intensity or purity of a pleasure. On the other hand, it is entirely feasible for an individual to determine that one pleasure is more intense or purer than another he has experienced and to quantify multiples qualities of pleasures, though Bentham understood that such 'calculations' were more impressionistic than mathematical. . . .Viewed in this light, the distance between Bentham and the supposed 'revisionism' of Mill's distinction between higher and lower pleasures is sharply reduced. (41).

Interestingly, the two later essays on "Subjective theories of well-being" (by Chris Heathwood) and "Objective theories of well-being (by Ben Bradley) both treat hedonism with considerable respect, and it is left as one flawed contender among all the other flawed contenders for the title of best account of well-being (the more familiar designation of "happiness" gets rather shorted here). Both essays, which might have been better divided or coordinated to avoid overlap, and which could have done a better job of describing and assessing such views as Aristotelian eudaimonism and Rawlsian "ideal" or need based theory, highlight the controversies rather than defending any one option: "Yet there is no consensus among philosophers concerning which general kind of theory of well-being is correct, or which specific version of any kind is best." (217). In fact, Bradley concludes his piece by observing that the popular objective/subjective distinction might need to be significantly revised, a point that has been effectively pursued by de Lazari-Radek and Singer in The Point of View of the Universe (chaps. 8-9).

But before reaching the two most extensive treatments of well-being, there are four essays on the basic structure of utilitarianism: Ben Eggleston on "Act utilitarianism," Dale Miller on "Rule utilitarianism," Julia Driver on "Global utilitarianism," and Elinor Mason on "Objectivism, subjectivism, and prospectivism." The essays by editors Eggleston and Miller are both extremely useful, and in many ways fill in for the abbreviated introduction to the volume as a whole (see, e.g., p. 132). Eggleston floats an abstract distinction between justifications for act utilitarianism, suggesting that the "Respecting individuals' interests" approach is not the same as the "Sum-ranking welfarist act consequentialism" approach. "The first strategy takes individuals' interests as fundamental and takes morality to be primarily concerned with resolving conflicts between those interests," whereas the second strategy is "primarily concerned with maximally promoting valuable states of affairs" (134-35). He suggests that "the first strategy has been preferred by more of the major figures in the history of utilitarianism," with the second receiving canonical formulation in the work of Sidgwick (135). But, among other problems with this approach, Sidgwick clearly deployed a complex set of justificatory moves, and something like the first strategy surely plays a role in his dialectical treatment of commonsense or intuitional morality, which emphasizes the ways in which the utilitarian standard is brought in to resolve conflicts generated by the familiar moral rules.

Still, Eggleston does rightly stress the familiar "standard" versus "decision procedure" distinction and how it allows for indirect forms of act utilitarianism, such that maximizing well-being may well involve not directly deploying the utilitarian standard in many decision contexts. This tactic could go as far as countenancing the legitimacy of, not only the usual moral rules of thumb, but a self-effacing or esoteric utilitarian morality, as in Sidgwick. Brisk defenses of just such a form of utilitarianism have recently been advanced, and they represent one of the strongest possible assaults on the Kantian revival spawned by Rawls.

Miller's contribution on rule utilitarianism helpfully reviews the history of the distinction between act and rule utilitarianism, which is largely an artifact of the twentieth century, though with such distinguished forebears as Bishop Berkeley, who receives some welcome recognition in this account. Miller also rightly focuses his attention on the sophisticated "ideal code" consequentialism of Brad Hooker, which harbors "a non-utilitarian theory of the good that assigns intrinsic value not only to well-being but also to virtue and to equality in the distribution of well-being." (148). Parfit's recent views are also better described in terms of rule consequentialism rather than rule utilitarianism, though of course much depends on how narrowly one draws the boundaries of utilitarianism. But other theorists given extended treatment here, such as Brandt, seem less subject to such interpretive questions.

Still, Miller does a fine job of showing how variable and eclectic such positions really are. After all, "Rule utilitarians, like act utilitarians, can adopt different conceptions of well-being, frame their theories in terms of either actual or expected outcomes, and make either average or total utility the object of promotion." (149). He rightly notes that much swings on one issue: "If to adopt a code is to internalize it, then ideal-code rule utilitarianism is almost certainly not extensionally equivalent with act utilitarianism. We just cannot internalize a moral code with an astronomical number of moral rules." (151). Things get murkier as act utilitarianism grows more indirect, in the limit allowing the possibility that maximal well-being even by act utilitarian standards might be best achieved by everyone internalizing, say, Brad Hooker's or Derek Parfit's views. But that would be a very self-effacing result indeed:

Recall that Hooker argues for rule consequentialism based on its close fit with our considered moral judgments and that Parfit argues for it on Kantian grounds. Neither argument is premised on what Hooker calls 'an overarching commitment to maximize the good.' Analogous arguments could potentially be given for rule utilitarianism specifically, arguments not premised on an overarching commitment to maximize utility. (163)

For his part, Hooker, in his probing contribution on "Utilitarianism and fairness," reviews "different kinds of utilitarianism and . . . different ideas about fairness" (280) before concluding that "possible conflict between rule utilitarianism and desert will be less than between act utilitarianism and desert." (301). He largely avoids the issue of utilitarian indirection, though he does consider such intriguing options as scalar utilitarianism, and he does interestingly explore the issue of "global utilitarianism":

Now if utilitarianism is understood as a family of theories each of which evaluates either acts or rules or both purely in terms of the aggregate welfare, how should we classify the member of this family that evaluates both acts and rules purely in terms of aggregate welfare? In some circles, this theory is called global utilitarianism.

Suppose the rule whose acceptance would maximize aggregate welfare could, in at least some situations, require an act that would not maximize aggregate welfare. Global utilitarianism would endorse accepting this rule, since by hypothesis its acceptance is welfare maximizing. At the very same time, global utilitarianism would condemn acts of compliance with the rule in these situations, since by hypothesis those acts are not welfare maximizing.

Act and rule utilitarians disagree primarily about what makes acts right or wrong. On this matter, global utilitarians agree completely with act utilitarians. Thus, global utilitarianism is a kind of act utilitarianism. (284-85).

But Julia Driver, in her provocative contribution on "Global utilitarianism," would seem to resist any such characterization of the global utilitarian attempt to evaluate "all things relevant to agency" (167) by the utilitarian standard. On her account, which moves largely at the level of consequentialism,

There are considerable theoretical advantages to global consequentialism. It allows for a much more nuanced account of moral evaluation, which, in turn, helps to explain instances of normative ambivalence in evaluation. The idea . . . is that there are evaluative situations in which modes of evaluation come apart, so a positive evaluation and a negative evaluation of the same thing are both, in their own way, appropriate. This is the case, for example, when one does the right thing for the wrong reason; or the wrong thing for the right reason . . . or in performing the wrong action, reveals a virtue. (172).

Thus, Driver seeks to accept the "conflicting guidance" offered by global utilitarianism, since such normative ambivalence might just be appropriate. Curiously, none of the authors in this volume seems willing to entertain an additional, reflexive possibility -- namely, that there may be a form of utilitarian assessment that could be used to judge between these very alternatives, the welfare maximizing potential of adopting an act or a rule or a global approach, etc. The ultimate utilitarian standard would then be to adopt the evaluative focal point or points that would maximize welfare, insofar as this could be determined.

Elinor Mason's piece on "Objectivism, subjectivism, and prospectivism" also seems to be highly tolerant of the ambiguity and ambivalence of ordinary moral assessment. She concludes her helpful account by stating that it "is clear that we use and understand objective, subjective, and prospective senses of our obligation terms. We may never eliminate the ambiguity in our uses of 'right' and 'ought'." (195). Furthermore, philosophically, "no clear winner has emerged from the philosophical disagreement about which of these senses is primary, but the debate is ongoing." (196).

Somewhat more divisive are the contributions by Jens Timmerman on "Kantian ethics and utilitarianism" and Daniel Russell on "What virtue ethics can learn from utilitarianism." Timmerman nicely accents the sharpest differences between Kantianism and utilitarianism, and he zeroes in on issues of publicity and transparency:

For Kant, the categorical imperative must directly determine human action, whereas for utilitarians it is sufficient that human action conform to the principle of utility. But this also means that Kant, but not utilitarianism, is committed to "transparency," in that his theory contains a requirement that the agent must understand -- not be deceived about -- the nature of morality. Because of the limitations of human calculative capacity utilitarians tend to discourage active reflection on and application of the greatest happiness principle. By contrast, for Kant, moral progress can only be achieved by gaining a better understanding of the nature of morality. (253).

Of course, one can scarcely doubt the commitment of the classical utilitarians (and most contemporary ones) to "moral progress through a better understanding of the nature of morality" -- consider Mill on Whewell and intuitionism, which were damned precisely for blocking inquiry into the basis of morality. But if Timmerman's point concerns the possibility of utilitarianism justifying indirect, self-effacing, and esoteric forms of morality, then it does indeed indicate some big and vital differences.

Russell, who self-identifies as a virtue ethicist, takes the refreshing course of explaining "what I think virtue ethicists like me can learn from the sorts of cause-and-effect thinking that have always been the hallmark of good utilitarian philosophy." (258). Intriguingly, he concludes that while "costs and benefits are not always the point," it is nonetheless true that results "are the point sometimes -- most of the time, in fact -- and that is why virtue ethics can learn so much from utilitarianism." (277). One cannot help but suspect that, in this case, a broader appreciation of the forms of utilitarianism and of Crisp's account of "Utilitarianism and the life of virtue" (Philosophical Quarterly 42, 1992) might have moved him even further up the utilitarian learning curve.

The book ends on a high note, with two powerful and very relevant, timely essays: William Shaw on "Utilitarianism and the ethics of war" and Tim Mulgan on "Utilitarianism and our obligations to future people." Shaw's piece is a very welcome reminder that, surprisingly enough, utilitarians have too often said too little about the ethics of war, and he comes around to making a plausible case for the claim that "if there is ever a utilitarian rationale for treating a rule as, in practice, categorical and without exceptions, the civilian-immunity rule would seem to be such a rule." (323). This is, obviously, a very timely reminder of just how much work still needs to be done on utilitarian practical ethics.

Mulgan's excellent contribution drives the point home with reference to utilitarianism and all the thorny problems of population ethics, made all the thornier by the prospect that future generations will confront a "broken world." As Mulgan puts it, in his conclusion:

Our moral intuitions, tailored to a disappearing affluent world, are no longer a reliable guide. Utilitarianism is often attacked for its willingness to think the unthinkable. The English Roman Catholic philosopher Elizabeth Anscombe went so far as to describe utilitarian thinking as the product of a corrupt mind. Perhaps, in a broken world, where the unthinkable must be thought, this willingness becomes, not a vice, but a necessary virtue. (345).

Mulgan very clearly and helpfully reviews the issues in this area: The Repugnant Conclusion that the total utilitarian view might recommend an extremely large population of lives only just worth living; the Non-Identity problem of how we could harm future people who would not exist but for the policies producing the harm; the Mere Addition paradox that poses the problem of how it could be wrong to, for example, produce a hermit whose life would be happy enough, but lower average happiness slightly, etc., etc. Naturally, he stresses the considerable advantages that utilitarianism, with its temporal neutrality and non-person-affecting approach, has over alternative frameworks, contractualist, Kantian or whatever, all of which stumble badly over various varieties of the non-identity problem. In these cases, "we have an action that seems intuitively wrong, but we cannot point to any particular individual who has been wronged or even harmed." (328). But he also recognizes that no particular version of a utilitarian solution is anything like problem free, and that the "possibility of real-world conflicts of interest between present and future people gives the question of what we owe to future people a new urgency." (332). This is all too true.

Although the Cambridge Companion to Utilitarianism thus covers much ground, it must be said that there is more ground to cover, and that utilitarianism is an even more diverse and fascinating subject than is indicated by this volume. The concern is not merely that some major figures (Godwin, Moore, Smart, and Singer) are neglected or treated too lightly, or that there is insufficient historical contextualization in many cases, or that the volume is rather too slanted toward a set of familiar academic concerns in certain regions of substantive ethical theory (e.g., act v. rule utilitarianism, rather than utilitarianism and non-human animals). What is also missing is a larger sense of the many different roads that can lead to utilitarian thinking, the different religious or non-religious, metaphysical or metaethical stances that can yield support for substantive utilitarian conclusions. This diversity goes beyond the theological (or Anglican) v. non-theological groundings for utilitarianism as discussed by Heydt in the first chapter, though that issue remains much more vibrant than this work indicates. Even such historical opponents of utilitarianism as Idealists have on occasion been turned to the utilitarian cause: from D. G. Ritchie in the 19th century to T. L. S. Sprigge in more recent years, there has been a position worthy of the name "Idealist utilitarianism," not that one would ever guess it from the Cambridge Companion to Utilitarianism.

Still, this is a fine and important work on its own terms, and it does convey much of the current excitement over utilitarianism, a view that is undergoing a renaissance for the very best of reasons.