The Cambridge Handbook of Cognitive Science

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Keith Frankish and William Ramsey (eds.), The Cambridge Handbook of Cognitive Science, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 352pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521871419.

Reviewed by Eric Mandelbaum, Harvard University, and Bryce Huebner, Georgetown University


In the early days of cognitive science, philosophers played substantial roles in the acquisition of data, formation of psychological hypotheses, and articulation of broader theories about the architecture of cognition. They examined disparate types of data, and constructed well-defined models to explain how those data hung together. The role of the philosopher as cognitive scientist is exemplified in Fodor's (1983) seminal work on the modularity of mind, and in Dennett's (1978) proposal of the false-belief task as a way to study the capacity for mentalizing. But it is also apparent in the work of Ned Block, Stephen Stich, Gilbert Harman, and many others who were attempting to build empirically adequate and philosophically ambitious theories. Even where these theories weren't true -- this is cognitive science after all -- they provided worked-out hypotheses and clearly articulated models that helped to advance debates within cognitive science.

Towards the end of the 1980s, the role of the philosopher began to shift. Rather than engaging in empirical theory construction, philosophers began to focus on more a priori, 'how possibly' questions about the naturalization of content and the relationship between minds and brains. Fortunately, the past decade has witnessed a resurgence of data-driven philosophy. An encouraging number of philosophers have revived the practice of empirically informed theory construction, developing innovative models of imagination (e.g., Nichols 2006), consciousness (e.g., Prinz 2012), and metacognition and self-knowledge (e.g., Carruthers 2011). Philosophers are once again working towards formulating testable hypotheses, in part by acquiring the empirical data themselves, and in part by relying on the data of others. Some philosophers have great noses for finding effects -- the astonishingly probative studies carried out by Joshua Knobe and his colleagues come readily to mind. Others have a keen eye for seeing how various data hang together in order to explain a philosophically interesting range of phenomena. These are positive developments for empirically inclined philosophers, but they also bring about their own set of problems.

The philosophy of cognitive science is once again at a crossroads, and the role of the philosopher in cognitive science is once again beginning to shift. In many cases, the rapid proliferation of data has outstripped the pace of theory. Though abstract theorizing has reemerged, much of it occurs in books that are too lengthy or technical to teach in undergraduate classrooms. The top journals in philosophy are not particularly inclined to publish theoretical cognitive science, and there is downright antipathy toward publishing philosophical approaches to theory construction in most of the well-known psychology journals. Even worse, many young philosophers are not adequately trained to handle the experimental aspects of cognitive science, while others receive such training but fail to develop the degree of theoretical sophistication that should be expected of philosophers. Against this backdrop, we think that volumes like The Cambridge Handbook of Cognitive Science are critically important: they provide a venue for relatively unconstrained data-driven theorizing, and they provide a resource to get young philosophers excited about working within the cognitive sciences. They also provide a high-level text for those who teach at the interface between theoretical and empirical cognitive science.

The Handbook is divided into three parts: Foundations, Aspects of Cognition, and Research Programs. In what follows we address each part individually, and then return to offer a brief evaluation of the book as a whole.

Part I: Foundations

William Bechtel and Adele Abrahamsen provide a gentle and relatively untendentious introduction to the history of the cognitive sciences. The paper is a breezy read, and it provides a clear overview of the types of questions that commonly emerge in the cognitive sciences. Barbara Von Eckardt's paper on the representational theory of mind is tougher going. Part of the problem is the focus on the naturalization of content debates that were dominant in the 1980s and 1990s. This paper covers all of that ground far too quickly, and it never engages with debates that are currently raging in the cognitive sciences (e.g., issues of representational format, the nature of distributed representations, and the nature of the 'minimal' representations required to sustain reinforcement learning). Paul Thagard, by contrast, provides an essay that cogently traces the disputes between rule-based and connectionist approaches to cognitive architecture. While one might think that this would be another cold debate, Thagard does a wonderful job of keeping the paper current. He offers a positive proposal about why the human brain might contain both connectionist and rule-based systems, and he shows how this proposal can be grounded in psychological data and computational models. He also accomplishes the significant feat of explaining connectionism in a way that is understandable to the uninitiated. The essay offers a nice example of the synthesizing role of philosophy in cognitive science. Of course, it does so by ignoring many important issues in cognitive architecture (e.g., dual process theories, modularity, the affect/cognition border), but it's hard to fault Thagard for his decision: the topic of cognitive architecture is a huge one, and this chapter is one of the few that will be accessible to introductory students while still being interesting to more advanced theorists.

Part II: Aspects of Cognition

The essays that constitute the second part of the volume are more of a mixed bag. Taken collectively, they fail to achieve the methodological continuity one would hope for in a book such as this. Many of the authors assert the conclusions of a study as if they were established facts, neither clarifying experimental methodology nor making clear theoretical interventions into the on-the-ground disputes about data collection or analysis. In these cases, the informed reader will often want to know how an experimental set-up or modeling strategy justifies a hypothesis, while uninformed readers will find themselves unsure about why various studies are mentioned in the first place. In part, this is because some papers are written for sophisticated readers who have substantial backgrounds in the cognitive sciences (this worry is most pronounced in the chapters on action, learning and memory, concepts, and language; we return to this issue below). But, some papers aim to defend a view to critics, without taking enough time to situate the view in a broader context, and others just amount to a defense of an idiosyncratic view. We worry that readers who lack the relevant background will struggle to keep up with many of the difficult discussions that occur in this part of the book. That said, there are some excellent and accessible papers here.

The best papers in this part are designed to introduce philosophers and cognitive scientists to one another's work. This is no easy task, but some of the authors perform it admirably. Casey O'Callaghan crisply lays out some traditional philosophical questions about perception (e.g., how can we best account for illusions and hallucinations?), while also creating space to discuss issues concerning the phenomenology of perception. Somehow he also fits in a robust discussion of empirical issues, such as the extent to which perception requires completion, filling in, inference, computation, and active interaction with the world. It is quite a task to cover so many different debates with such clarity, but the chapter somehow manages to do so. Jesse Prinz offers a similarly accessible, even-handed, and well structured discussion of the cognitive science of emotion; and William Lycan does what he does best -- he makes distinctions, lays out positions in logical space, and shows how important philosophers of cognitive science are for the project of clarifying discussions of consciousness. For their part, Mike Oaksford, Nick Chater, and Neil Stewart offer a more polemical account of reasoning and decision making, but their approach is judicious and detailed in its presentation of data, theory, and the relation between the two. Their chapter does an outstanding job of delivering empirical results by explaining the mechanics of a study. We have no doubt that philosophers and cognitive scientists will find plenty to disagree with in their approach, but at every point it will be clear where that disagreements lies.

The chapter by Charan Ranganath, Laura Libby, and Ling Wong on human learning and memory offers a plausible overview of research on memory, though it has little to say about the rapidly expanding range of research on the mechanisms that support human learning. Further, they do not engage with recent (or for that matter traditional) philosophical approaches to learning or memory. We think that this is particularly unfortunate because recent research on learning is fertile ground for philosophers and cognitive scientists alike. The Handbook might have been better served if it had dealt with learning in a separate chapter.

The papers that defend a view against criticism without taking enough time to situate the view in a broader context are a bit harder to evaluate. Ray Jackendoff's paper on language, for example, is well written and engaging, but it will be a tough read for anyone who is not well versed in the core disputes of theoretical linguistics. More troublingly, Jackendoff focuses on articulating a set of issues that are of central concern to his model of language and cognition, giving less time than we would have liked to the concerns that tend to bother philosophers who are interested in linguistics. While there is a quick discussion of the evolution of language, it would have been nice to see a more extended discussion of poverty-of-the-stimulus arguments, nativism, and the role of statistical learning in language acquisition. The article does articulate an interesting and novel approach to the study of language, and it is worth reading for just that reason. But woe unto those who attempt to use this chapter as teaching material for novices.

Similarly, Elisabeth Pacherie's chapter on action presupposes too much working knowledge of both philosophy and cognitive science. She includes an overview of issues in the philosophy of action and discusses the nature of motor cognition, but she never makes it clear how the research she discusses is supposed to be relevant to the philosophical debates. Pacherie does present her 'comparator model' of motor control, and those familiar with her work will see how this helps to bridge the gap between philosophical and scientific discussions of 'ownership.' But she doesn't make it easy for those who are unfamiliar with her work to see how to proceed. More troublingly, Pacherie moves too quickly over the scientific data in many places. For example, she notes that there is a smaller temporal gap between a voluntary act and the perceived effect, than between a nonvoluntary act and its perceived effect. However, she never explains how this phenomenon was uncovered, nor how big the difference in perceived time is supposed to be. Since The Handbook is designed to be used by upper-level undergraduates and beginning graduate students in philosophy, as well as professional academics who don't know the field particularly well, this type of telling rather than showing will frustrate many readers. An interested epistemologist, philosopher of physics, or graduate student who is new to cognitive science might want to use The Handbook to get started. But each will want to do more than simply guess at the sorts of time scales at play in this type of effect. Moreover, these effects aren't just facts that hang on their own: they are conclusions of arguments, and the experimental design and data are important premises in these arguments. By not presenting them, the authors lose an opportunity to teach students how to do top-rate cognitive science, which is in part achieved by scrutinizing experimental designs and getting a feel for the data.

Perhaps the most troubling paper in this regard is Gregory Murphy and Aaron Hoffman's article on concepts. There is no discussion of work by Susan Carey, Alison Gopnik, Jerry Fodor, or Jesse Prinz, and there is no attempt to address paradigmatic philosophical issues of any kind (e.g., systematicity, productivity, publicity). This chapter does offer a brief overview of Murphy's own thoughts about concepts, but one would hope for a lot more in a paper that is designed to introduce novices to the issues that arise in the cognitive science of concepts.

Part III: Research Program

The concluding part of the book offers a well-structured and broad-minded account of a variety of ongoing approaches to the study of cognition. It begins with a paper by Dominic Standage and Thomas Trappenberg on cognitive neuroscience. They open with a discussion of the thorny issues involved in drawing inferences from neuroscientific experiments, but quickly move on to a detailed computational analysis of episodic memory. While we applaud the rigor with which they present their analysis, there is reason to doubt its pedagogical effectiveness. Even an advanced graduate student in the philosophy of cognitive science will have trouble following this discussion without a great deal more guidance. This is disappointing as their chapter starts off quite strong, and it would be nice to have a solid foundation from which to carry out philosophical investigations of the central inferences involved in interpreting neuroimaging experiments and their relation to psychological theories.

But the remaining chapters in this part do a fantastic job of offering clear and accessible introductions to philosophically rich areas of inquiry. H. Clark Barrett's take on evolutionary psychology is predictably partial, but he offers a nice defense of the project and introduces the program in a compelling way, both with respect to the core issues that have dominated evolutionary psychology and to emerging research topics. Andy Clark's chapter on embodied, embedded, and extended cognition is similarly biased, but it provides an engaging and exciting introduction to outsider cognitive science. The hypotheses are clearly presented and arguments as well as counter-arguments are laid out in a way that is accessible to undergraduates while remaining interesting for professional philosophers who are unfamiliar with the view. Finally, Sara Shettleworth's chapter on animal cognition is both widely accessible and wildly interesting. She concisely introduces many of the core issues in cognitive ethology such as debates concerning anthropomorphization, Morgan's Canon, episodic memory, pattern-learning, consciousness, numerical cognition, and theory of mind. While she covers an enormous range of data, she does so in a way that is clear and provocative.

Overall Thoughts and Worries

In general, The Handbook provides a fantastic introduction to a few important research programs, but it's handling of the more specific topics is a bit uneven. We are well aware that The Handbook faces limitations of space, as well as conceptual limitations imposed by the nature of the project. It is not always possible to provide detailed explanations of data, and as we noted above, there are cases where doing so isn't really necessary. In fact, there are some cases where providing detailed explanations of the data would lead an author to miss out on a discussion of broader philosophical issues (e.g., in O'Callaghan's and Lycan's chapters). As we noted above, some contributors clearly see through these problems and provide clear overviews of the multifarious theoretical issues that arise in perception, emotion, consciousness, reasoning and decision making. There are cases where on-the-ground questions about the nature of the data do not exhaust the issues that a philosopher of cognitive science must study -- so chapters like this have an important role to play. However, sometimes the reporting of experimental design and data is of central interest to the question at hand. We think this is particularly important where the training of new philosophers of cognitive science is concerned. These are the very avenues that young philosophers of cognitive science must take to learn how to engage in empirically informed theory construction. Top psychology programs produce fantastic experimental psychologists, but not much time is spent educating psychology graduate students on theoretical issues. If we are to have a younger generation of informed cognitive theoreticians, we need to show them how to interweave design, theory, and data. Otherwise, we risk losing out on the benefits of having a truly interdisciplinary field.

Even worse, without the timely (though no doubt intermittent) reporting of design and data, the philosophy of cognitive science risks becoming nothing more than sophisticated science reporting. To avert this, philosophers must do something that is far too rarely done in empirical psychology itself: they must give detailed explanations of why experiments are set-up in the way that they are, and they must explain why the data collected from an experiment make a given hypothesis more likely than its competitors. If philosophers are to regain a role within the cognitive sciences, they need to read empirical studies closely, uncover enthymemes inherent in psychological arguments, and construct broad, elegant, and empirically informed theories and hypotheses. This volume and others like it will help along the way, but we still have a long way to go.


Carruthers, P. (2011). The Opacity of Mind: An Integrative Theory of Self-Knowledge. New York: Oxford University Press.

Dennett, D. (1978). "Beliefs about Beliefs." Behavioral and Brain Sciences 4: 568-70.

Fodor, Jerry A. (1983). The Modularity of Mind: An Essay on Faculty Psychology. Cambridge: MIT Press.

Nichols, S., ed. (2006), The Architecture of the Imagination: New Essays on Pretence, Possibility, and Fiction. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Prinz, J. (2012). The Conscious Brain: How Attention Engenders Experience. Oxford: Oxford University Press.