The Cambridge History of Eighteenth-Century Philosophy

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Knud Haakonssen (ed.), The Cambridge History of Eighteenth-Century Philosophy (two volumes), Cambridge University Press, 2006, 1407pp., $250.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521418542.

Reviewed by James A. Harris, University of St Andrews


Knud Haakonssen's long-awaited Cambridge History of Eighteenth-Century Philosophy is an achievement equal in importance and stature to its illustrious predecessors in the Cambridge History of Philosophy series. It is impossible to imagine this book being superseded for years to come. It comprises thirty-six chapters collected under five headings: 'The Concept of Eighteenth-Century Philosophy', 'The Science of Human Nature', 'Philosophy and Theology', 'Natural Philosophy', and 'Moral Philosophy'. Immediately striking is the fact that the chapters are devoted to topics and problems, and not to individual philosophers or particular philosophical schools. This is exactly as it should be. A history of eighteenth-century philosophy that restricted itself to chapters on canonical figures, using standard means of categorisation, could do little or nothing to refashion our understanding of the period. It would merely give us again the eighteenth-century that subsequent philosophers and their epigoni have constructed as a means of making sense of and legitimating their own particular projects and agendas. Haakonnssen's book, by contrast, while of course returning again and again to Locke and Hume, Wolff and Kant, Condillac and d'Alembert, puts the familiar in the company of many of their rather less well known contemporaries. Hume's 'Of Miracles' is set by M. A. Stewart in the context of a debate about the rational basis of revealed religion carried by, amongst others, John Toland, Anthony Collins, Matthew Tindal, Thomas Woolston, Peter Annet, Arthur Sykes and Conyers Middleton. Udo Thiel describes reactions to Locke on personal identity from, not only Butler and Reid, but also Samuel Clarke, Berkeley, Collins, Edmund Law and Condillac. The result is untidy and distinctly unfriendly to the notion of the history of philosophy as linear and progressive. Old ideas and arguments refuse to die and disappear; new ones are by turns ignored, misunderstood, and traduced.

In his opening chapter, Haakonssen describes and puts in their historical context two ways of characterising eighteenth-century philosophy. The first identifies the philosophy of this period as the core of that wider cultural and social movement, 'the Enlightenment'. It is made problematic by the degree to which the concept of the Enlightenment itself has 'been shaped and reshaped by the culture wars of later periods' (p. 6). The second has it that the theory of knowledge is the core of 'early modern philosophy', and that the eighteenth century is to be seen as a stage of a narrative that begins with Bacon and Descartes and ends with Reid and Kant. The 'epistemological paradigm', Haakonssen points out, is something of a historical accident, fashioned in the first instance by Reid and Kant and their followers. It is also seriously at odds with the eighteenth-century's own understanding of the tasks of philosophy. It has distorted treatment of the period's ethics and aesthetics, to the point where it is made to seem as though the only issues raised in these areas were questions of justification, whereas large amounts of philosophical energy were expended on questions of description, classification and explanation. It makes it very difficult to understand why what we now call science was then often called 'natural philosophy'. It obscures the continuing vitality of the idea that philosophy is as much a distinct way of life as it is a mode of analysis, an idea that, as Haakonssen intriguingly suggests, helps to explain such things as the period's pervasive use of ad hominem argumentation and the staying power of the classification of doctrines along the lines of the divisions between the ancient schools. The moral Haakonssen draws is that we should 'let the concept of philosophy itself be part of the object for historical investigation' (p. 21). And this surely is the right way to proceed. Our current conception of what counts as philosophy is very far from being the only possible conception. When one confronts the eighteenth century -- perhaps when one confronts any century other than the twentieth and twenty-first -- one finds a very great deal that takes itself to be philosophy, but that does not look like philosophy as we know it. It was only in the nineteenth century, in fact, that 'philosophy' began to be sharply distinguished from psychology, from natural science, from social science, from anthropology, from theology, and from history.

The core of Haakonssen's eighteenth century is 'philosophical anthropology'. It is in the section entitled 'The Science of Human Nature' that one finds the chapters on perception, personal identity, reason, substance and modes, space and time, causality, knowledge and belief, scepticism, the philosophy of language, aesthetics, and the active powers. But before one gets to them, one has to reckon with what, at 73 pages, is by far the longest chapter in the whole book, 'Human Nature', by Aaron Garrett. In an extraordinary feat of scholarship and synthesis, Garrett shows how the official eighteenth-century view that, in his words, 'human nature is everywhere uniform and unites humankind both as objects of study and as subjects capable of enlightenment' (p. 160) is constantly questioned and qualified by near obsessive interest in difference: in sexual differences, racial differences, and differences of 'national character'. There was also the question of how 'human nature', if there really in the end is such a thing, is to be characterized. This question was often answered in the context of the comparison and contrast of human beings with animals, a context in which, Garrett shows, moral issues, and the idea that what animals share with us in the way of passions and capacity for suffering might be sufficient to give them rights limiting how we can treat them, were seldom far away. The orangutan was of special interest to such as Linnaeus, Buffon, Rousseau, Monboddo, and Herder. Notoriously, Rousseau and Monboddo asserted, not that men were apes, but that some apes might be best regarded as uncultivated men. Rousseau connected the categorisation of orangutans with the issue of where to place peoples whose languages we cannot understand and the 'wild children' discovered from time to time who seemed to be neither properly animal nor properly human. Garrett reminds us of the various ways in which such problem cases figured in philosophical discussion of language, mind, morals, and politics.

Yet when one moves on from Garrett's chapter to Kenneth P. Winkler on 'Perception and Ideas, Judgement', and then on from there through the rest of the section, it is easy to lose one's grip on how, exactly, it is that human nature might be, as the reader is told in the blurb on the first page of the book, 'the dominant concept in philosophy' in the eighteenth century. Of course, one might think immediately of Hume's Treatise of Human Nature, and of the manner in which the careful reader of that book is forced to accept that there is no means of separating out its 'philosophical' argument from matters psychological, sociological, and historical. But the 'philosophical anthropology' on display in the Treatise, and in other eighteenth-century treatments of perception, memory, reason, judgment, volition, and so on, is distinctly less rich and colourful than that described by Garrett. It remains unclear, this is to say, how what one might call the outwardly-directed inquiry into human nature conducted on the basis of the discoveries being made in the eighteenth-century about non-European peoples and about what we now call biology is to be connected with the inwardly-directed, very often simply introspective, analyses of the operations of mind carried out by Hume, Berkeley, Condillac, Hartley, and Reid. And then there is the German philosophy of the period. One of the great strengths of this Cambridge History is the coverage it gives to German thought from Thomasius through to Fichte. In his chapter on 'Knowledge and Belief', Manfred Kuehn argues that the Wolffian philosophy that dominated eighteenth-century German philosophy until Kant's critical revolution was not, as it is sometimes said, wholly hostile to the Lockeanism that was so successful in Britain and France. Wolff's philosophy, Kuehn claims, 'was meant to be a marriage of reason and experience (connubius rationis et experientiae), and even if this was not meant to be a marriage of equal partners, reason and experience were still partners' (p. 395). In Thomasius, Wolff's great rival, the influence of Locke is even clearer. However, it is hard to make any connection at all between the accounts given in various chapters of German contributions to analysis of the powers of the human mind and the inquiries into human nature presented by Garrett in his chapter. And when Kant arrives, as he does at the end of several chapters, to transpose the question at hand into a completely new key, the notion of 'human nature' in play is, as a matter of conceptual necessity, absolutely unvarying across time and place. Perhaps, though, this is to see Kant's critical philosophy as not really part of the eighteenth-century mainstream at all, but, instead, as an announcement of the beginning of the long nineteenth-century project of creating for philosophy a method and a subject-matter different and distinct from all kinds of empirical investigation.

Haakonssen points out in his introductory chapter that one of the consequences of the imposition of the 'epistemological paradigm' has been that eighteenth-century political theory is treated as a subject separate from the period's main line of philosophical argument: 'The idea that a concern with the possibility of social living and its political implications could be the fundamental problem in philosophy, and that metaphysics and epistemology were to be seen as esoteric leaning without a claim to primacy and universality, has therefore been more or less incomprehensible' (p. 14). Nevertheless, there is only one chapter on political philosophy, by Wolfgang Kersting. This is an excellent survey, but of a huge field, and from a great height. 2006, it is to be admitted, saw the publication not only of Haakonssen's volumes but also of The Cambridge History of Eighteenth-Century Political Thought, edited by Mark Goldie and Robert Wokler. But the very fact that Cambridge University Press is running two distinct series of histories, one devoted to 'philosophy', the other to 'political thought', is a manifestation of precisely the alienation from philosophy of one of its central concerns that Haakonssen identifies. Despite itself, this History of Eighteenth-Century Philosophy threatens to reinforce the idea that discussion of perception, personal identity, causality, and so on, is first philosophy, with moral and political philosophy situated somewhere downstream, or, to change the metaphor, with moral and political philosophy as branches rather than trunk.

There are only two chapters on moral philosophy proper, one by David Fate Norton and Manfred Kuehn on 'The Foundations on Morality', the other by Stephen Darwall on 'Norm and Normativity'. Rewarding though they both are, these two chapters make an odd couple. The first does an excellent job at discrediting the idea that what is nowadays called meta-ethics takes us to the heart of moral philosophy in the eighteenth century. The central question, rather, concerned whether or not human nature could be appealed to in order to explain the sense possessed by all human beings of there being a real distinction between virtue and vice. Mandeville had posed this question with unignorable sharpness, and many, from Hutcheson and Butler through Hume to Smith, sought in different ways to vindicate the sentiments as the foundation of morality. Others looked rather to principles of reason. This was for the first half of the century a largely British debate. In France and Germany, philosophers 'were more concerned with fostering a certain kind of morality than with the analysis of foundational questions' (p. 971).  To the extent that the Germans took up the question at all, they tended to favour reason over sentiment, and this presented Kant with a problem: 'Should he follow Hutcheson, Hume, and Smith, or should he follow his German contemporaries?' (p. 978). His solution was to favour reason over sentiment, but a reason transformed to the point of being utterly different from that of the 'rationalists' of the past. This rings true as an account of what eighteenth-century moral philosophy is about. The same cannot be said of Stephen Darwall's chapter, which, to this reader, seems to try too hard at finding anticipations of and early answers to distinctively Kantian questions concerning the 'roots of oughtness'. Few eighteenth-century philosophers -- certainly not Hutcheson, or Hume, or Smith -- had interesting things to say in answer to the question 'Why should I be virtuous rather than vicious?'. It was usually just taken for granted that the virtuous life is a happier life than the vicious, either because of the rewards promised to the virtuous by Christian revelation, or, in the manner of moderate Stoicism, because of the happiness intrinsic to virtuous character itself. Butler and Reid have a central place for conscience and the idea of duty, but neither has an explanation of why we should act as duty requires. Both, in fact, appear to regard the question as unintelligible. Haakonssen is right to insist that eighteenth-century philosophy is not exclusively concerned with justification, and it is a shame that more space was not given here to, for example, taxonomies of the duties of practical ethics, or classificatory analyses of the principles of action. The importance of ancient philosophy, especially philosophia togata, to eighteenth-century ethics might also have been given a chapter of its own.

There is not space here to do anything but mention a number of chapters that strike out in new and very promising directions: Ann Thomson on the informal circulation of philosophical ideas, Peter France on the rhetorical strategies used by philosophical texts, Simone Zurbuchen on the perceived importance of religion to civil society, Dario Perenetti on philosophies of history. Mention should also be made of a very substantial 'Biographical appendix', with biographical information and a list of major works for everyone from Thomas Abbt (author of various influential books on civic virtue) to Johann Zedler ('Publisher of the main encyclopedic reference work of the German Enlightenment'). The bibliography of cited works published before 1800 is 55 pages long, and must include around 1500 entries. Even so, the focus of the book is very much upon what was taught and published in Britain, France, and Germany. There is not much about the rest of Europe, and virtually nothing at all about what might have been happening outside of Europe, to the east, and to the south.