The Cambridge History Of Jewish Philosophy: The Modern Era (Volume 2)

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Martin Kavka, Zachary Braiterman, and David Novak (eds.), The Cambridge History Of Jewish Philosophy: The Modern Era (Volume 2), Cambridge University Press, 2012,  891pp., $200.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521852432.

Reviewed by Jeffrey A. Bernstein, College of the Holy Cross


What is the philosophical meaning of a volume that surveys and delimits an entire historical period? One can presume that it addresses the entire period and numerous aspects contained therein. Can one presume that it provides an adequate overview of the period in question? Moreover, if said period (in the opinion of many) is still underway, how can such an overview be at all possible? These questions (the last in particular) constitute the intellectual atmosphere in which the essays contained in the second volume of the Cambridge History of Jewish Philosophy: The Modern Era circulate. While the first volume deals with Jewish philosophy from antiquity up to the seventeenth century, the second volume continues up to the present day. Thus, while the history and significance of pre-modern Jewish philosophy may be subject to numerous revisions and re-canonizations, there is little doubt that it constitutes a definite period that contains attendant virtues (and perhaps vices). But insofar as volume two charts a period over which its very termination date is in dispute, it lacks even the (conventional) canonical meaning assumed to exist for historical periods. Our initial question stands: Is an adequate overview of modern Jewish philosophy possible? Philosophical accounts of historical periods, Hegel famously noted, occur only when those periods teeter on the verge of death. Is this the case with modern Jewish philosophy? On the eve of the previous Shabbat, have the owls of Weimar, Vilna, and New York (as it were) yet taken flight?

If so, this in no way implies that the issues themselves, contained in this impressive collection, cease to be living. It means, rather, that the volume raises the problem of modern Jewish philosophy (whether that problem be one of chronology, thematic unity, or even the very right to self-determination as a historical period). As Martin Kavka notes in the introduction,

To give an account of the history of Jewish philosophy in the modern era, and even of possibilities for using this history in future scholarship, is to portray only the alternatives for a solution. It is not to offer that solution itself. If a fundamental solution does exist, a later volume will undoubtedly uncover it. But its discovery will have been predicated on a selection from the varieties of concept-use detailed in the chapters that follow (30).

The approach taken in this volume on modern Jewish philosophy, therefore, expresses an appropriately modern (i.e., reflexive) awareness about its own predicament as modern; the goal is neither to erect a monument in its honor nor to give it (in the words of Zunz and Steinchneider) a decent burial; rather, it is to provide (in good Kantian fashion) the conditions for the possibility of determining its canon, periodicity and central thematic issues. It accomplishes this by pluralizing the voices heard and the issues raised, and it succeeds mightily.

In order to better appreciate how it succeeds,, we might glance at the difference between the organization of this volume and its predecessor. Volume one is divided into six main headings: (1) texts and contexts, (2) logic and language, (3) natural philosophy, (4) epistemology and psychology, (5) metaphysics and philosophical theology, and (6) practical philosophy.[1] The division appears traditional enough, although one might argue that it expresses a slight Anglo-American bias towards systematicity. Nevertheless, few would claim that Maimonides had no concern with language, or that Ibn Gabirol had no metaphysical insights, or that Joseph Albo had nothing to say about practical philosophy. Contrast this with the following five-fold organization of volume two: (1) Judaism's encounter with modernity, (2) retrieving tradition, (3) modern Jewish philosophical theology, (4) Jewish peoplehood, and (5) issues in modern Jewish philosophy (vii-ix). In volume two, the major concerns appear to center around modernity, tradition, and peoplehood. Put differently, it seems that a "traditional" philosophical vocabulary has been replaced with a set of terms focusing on concrete (dare one say, 'practical'?) issues that signal Judaism's (and thus Jewish philosophy's) engagement with a wider world. Is this change of horizon reducible to the well-worn narrative of "leaving the ghetto and becoming cosmopolitan"? If this narrative is correct, it needs (I believe) to be supplemented with reflections on what this cosmopolitanization ushered in. Put differently, it is quite easy to limit and unify one's philosophical vision when one is in a state of relative isolation; in this respect, we might say that the Haskalah (in keeping with the philosophical thrust of the Enlightenment more generally) made a more practical orientation inevitable insofar as Judaism now was in direct and continuous contact with all aspects of the European societies in which it existed. For this reason, there is (in the words of Michael Zank) a "heteronomous" character to modern Jewish philosophy that was arguably not present in the same respect prior to the seventeenth century.[2]

One also sees that, like its predecessor, volume two is organized thematically rather than around authorial figures. This provides a nice venue both for the exploration of the matters themselves as well as for the establishment of a canon that contains lesser-known and under-appreciated figures. MJP certainly makes good on this possibility. If we momentarily adopt a sports analogy, we might say that the number of "second-string" figures, to which the book introduces its readers, would make up a very substantial baseball, football or hockey roster.[3] Nevertheless, the elite superstars of this canon would amount to a familiar front-line basketball team, with Hermann Cohen, Franz Rosenzweig, and Martin Buber as the Big Three, and Emmanuel Levinas, Baruch Spinoza, and Moses Mendelssohn rotating in. One cannot help but suspect that the canon has, in a certain sense, been decided upon. This will be embraced by some and questioned by others, but it does exert a helpful gravitational pull on an extremely diverse set of religious and philosophical "objects". That the Cambridge series has seen fit to organize the volume around themes, rather than figures, emphasizes the open quality of this period (which some contributors choose to refer to as 'contemporary' rather than 'modern', presumably in order to show that the aforementioned Owl has not yet taken flight).

There can be no question of adequately presenting an 800-plus page edited collection in the allotted space; my discussion should be understood as an introduction that invites the reader to use and peruse this substantial volume.

As mentioned above, a great deal of what has come to be known as 'modern philosophy' is characterized by a reflexive concern as it relates to earlier periods. In the context of Jewish thought, this becomes manifest as a concern over tradition -- i.e., in what respect is modern Jewish philosophy a break with tradition in favor of innovation? Willi Goetschel shows how Baruch Spinoza and Moses Mendelssohn, in their inaugurations of modern Jewish thought as a praxis, sought to blur the easy lines between tradition and innovation: "the radical edge of Spinoza's point is not that tradition should be banned as evil and nefarious, but . . . that tradition from the beginning represents the performance of its own reinvention" (53). Differently stated, tradition is, in fact, simultaneouslytransmission and transformation; this is what allows for unity and recognition over time as well as adaptation to new contexts: "Mendelssohn's conception of Judaism is thus both traditional and innovative as it suggests that to preserve tradition is only possible by actualizing it, which, in turn, requires an interpretive hermeneutic process itself constitutive to the production of meaning" (66). That said, it is most definitely not the case that such production occurs ex nihilo.

Whether the "prime matter" of Judaism is the Torah or God's covenant with Israel, transmission and transformation are indexed to earlier concepts and issues that are taken as fundamental for the origin(s) and/or goal(s) of Judaism. As David Novak notes, no less a creative and synthetic thinker than Franz Rosenzweig remains eminently faithful to tradition in his emphasis on the revealed "Torah from heaven": "the Torah is the telos for which the world has been created. The Torah as telos . . . is the transcendent end or purpose of creation; it is not immanent within the world . . . Rosenzweig comes [close] to rabbinic theology insofar as his main concern is the rabbis' main concern: revelation" (391, 397)." Although Rosenzweig provides an account of the divine-human relationship that is greatly shaped by German Idealism and German Expressionism, his account remains in line with the normative rabbinic tradition as it concerns revealed law.

But how are we moderns to understand the Law -- i.e., Halakhah? Does modern Judaism call for obedience or interpretation? Ought we philosophize more or less? Avi Sagi charts the emerging trend of "philosophy of Halakhah" and gives a somewhat skeptical answer to the claim that we are nearing a unity of understanding and interpretation concerning the Law:

Can we expect one philosophy of Halakhah to develop in the future? It is doubtful. Not because of the weakness of the philosophy but because 'Halakhah' is such a multifaceted term denoting many manifestations: religious and other norms, canonical texts, halakhic-scholarly discourse, various genres, all different at various times and places. Whoever understands the complex world of Halakhah cannot expect more than that (517).

Differently stated, the question of Law leads the modern Jewish philosopher directly back to the question concerning the origin and legitimacy of interpretations. Concerning the issue of legitimating normativity, Jonathan Malino offers James Kugel's four criteriological claims about how pre-modern thinkers read the Torah in order to provide a lens through which one might decide upon the canonical status of textual interpretation: (1) the Torah is a relevant book, (2) the Torah speaks cryptically, (3) The Torah is a perfect (i.e., unified and harmonious) document, and (4) the Torah comes from God (793). Lest these criteria seem a trifle old fashioned, Malino elucidates: "what may be most valuable in Kugel's tour is the way history subtly gives way to theological proclamation" (798). Coupling Kugel's criteria with Harry Frankfurt's conception of second-order desire (i.e., the desire to have a first-order [i.e., conventionally understood] desire) as applied to question of canonicity, allows Malino to formulate the issue thus: "to affirm that the Torah is canonical is to affirm (and, hence, declare) one's love of Torah as part of a broader love of Judaism" (804). Does this solve the dilemma raised by Sagi? One might say, deferentially, that such love of Torah is a necessary, but not sufficient, condition for the legitimation of norms in modern Jewish philosophy.

If, that is, such legitimation is even part of the project. This, too, is up for examination. Peter Ochs, a founder of the Textual Interpretation school, views such philosophy as "serv[ing] as a laboratory within which scholars explore the various methods and the results of inquiry that would follow when they plant their work in the soils of various kinds of Jewish text-study" (195). For Ochs, the old saying '3 Jews, 4 opinions' would indeed have an utterly affirmative meaning; if tradition grows through attempts at innovation, the more we reap, the more we sow. This ultimately dialogical approach would hold not only for the creation of new traditions, but for the perception (over time as well as momentarily) of a unified modern Jewish philosophy as well. As Aaron Hughes notes, "It is the dialogic relationships that form among these elements in time that permit one to encounter reality as a whole" (242). Dialogue has always been a part of Judaism and Jewish philosophy; however, according to Hughes, its function has changed dramatically:

when premodern thinkers were interested in dialogue, they tended to emphasize its literary genre, using the conversational aspect afforded by it to articulate a set of beliefs in the light of various competing or antagonistic beliefs. Dialogue, therefore, enabled these thinkers to clear a space for their own understanding of Judaism and, in the process, provided a convenient means for disseminating this understanding to a broader reading public that was not necessarily trained in the technical aspects of Greco-Arabic philosophy. In the modern period, by contrast, Jewish thinkers tend to be much more concerned with the philosophical principles behind the concept of dialogue as a living, spontaneous engagement with another (237).

Given the emphasis on the principle of dialogue, then, Zank's claim about heteronomy becomes completely comprehensible; modern Jewish philosophy is always responding to circumstances and situations both inside and outside its immediate purview. This is yet another way to make sense of the claim that it is always responding to traditional Judaism, as Norbert Samuelson states (428). According to Adam Shear, the rationalist strands of modern Jewish philosophy in Eastern Europe "were modeled on and influenced by the classic texts of medieval Jewish thought: [Maimonides']The Guide of the Perplexed, [Judah Halevi's] Kuzari, and [Bahya Ibn Pakuda's] The Duties of the Heart" (266). Similarly, according to Goetschel, rationalist modern Jewish philosophy -- in the light of Solomon Maimon's thought -- "[was] confronted with the challenge to qualify as Kantian. The group of Kantian legitimists made Kantian thought a school no Jewish philosopher could afford to bypass. Only with Martin Buber and Franz Rosenzweig was that view challenged" (71). Nowhere, perhaps, was this "dialogue" with Kant more evident than in the modern appropriation of Maimonides. For Shear, "In his commentary on The Guide of the Perplexed, Solomon Maimon fully embraced the radical interpretation of Maimonides [which] offer[ed] a ringing endorsement for reason and philosophy" (261). However (as Shear notes), Abraham Socher holds this reading of Maimonides to actually stem from "the Aristotelian-Averroistic tradition" (260-261). We might suggest that the dialogue between Aristotle-Averroes-Maimonides (on the one hand) and Kant (on the other) occurs as a result of the analogous emphases on the question of law. At any rate, the re-situation of premodern thought within a Kantian context takes on a similar shape in the work of Hermann Cohen. For Elliot Wolfson, "The Kantian framing of Maimonides is predicated on Cohen's belief that no offense should be taken at the fact that reason is the 'root of the content of revelation', since the 'correlation of God and man . . . has as an unavoidable consequence a kind of identity of logical reason in both'" (674). In at least one of its major vicissitudes, therefore, modern Jewish philosophy is very much a religion within the bounds of reason.

As with issues of tradition and textual interpretation, modern Jewish philosophy exhibits a similar heteronomy or dialogical character concerning politics. Enlightenment Judaism (and therefore modern Jewish philosophy) had to continually justify its existence before the tribunals of European civilization. If the situation is not simply analogous regarding the State of Israel (and its founding ideals in political Zionism), it is not completely distinct either. Zachary Braiterman holds that, in an illustration of the Hegelian conception of "recognition", "the future of Zionism may ironically depend upon some form of agreement with those who have the greatest stake in resisting the disaster it forced upon them, and which they were unable to contain" (626). Yet the relation between modern Jewish philosophy and politics is not simply reducible to the question of state sovereignty in general or of the State of Israel in particular. Leora Batnitzky holds that modern Jewish philosophy has recently undertaken multiple exploratory philosophical projects attempting to construe politics as based on agreement (Kaplan), disagreement (Strauss) and balance of powers within the context of covenantal relations (Mittleman, Novak) (597-601).

In this vein, Randi Rashkover's analysis of the Biblical Covenant, by means of Spinoza and supplemented by Rosenzweig, is instructive: "Spinoza's portrait of the biblical covenant needs the supplement of a phenomenology of revelation as the enactment of a divine freedom that can simultaneously affirm and lawfully delimit human desire, thereby resolving the tension between material particularity and need and cross-cultural communication" (413). Does this fall within the bounds of politics proper? As stated above, the goal of the volume is not to pretend to provide definitive answers, but rather to raise possibilities and questions. This questioning stance is exhibited clearly in the juxtaposition of [1] Shmuel Trigano's claim that "Sacrifice is . . . at the heart of the Jewish vocation . . . The community needs a sanctuary and sacrificial worship to unite, and so sacrifice becomes the purpose of the community, for 'the I is in need of the community for the confession of its sins'" (564), and [2] Ken Koltun-Fromm's invocation of Emil Fackenheim's 614th commandment: that after Hitler, survival (for the purpose of witness) is the main responsibility of the Jewish people (143). Whichever way this question ultimately is decided, it seems that the prophetic call to justice will have to play a role if modern Jewish philosophy is to be "true to its biblical and rabbinic foundations" (as Michael Zank notes) (734).

The difficulties attendant upon critiquing an 800-plus page volume lie in the simple fact that such critiques are made too easily and with no sweat of the brow. Put differently, in a volume this size, many openings exist in which one can point to the "heteronomy" of editorial, textual, thematic choices. Nonetheless, if I say that I would have liked to see more Adorno, Benjamin, Strauss, Leibowitz and Teitelbaum, the appropriate response can only be "then put out a successor volume!" In that respect, this wonderful volume makes good on its initial promise and leaves the burden of innovation solely with the reader.

[1] The Cambridge History Of Jewish Philosophy: From Antiquity Through The Seventeenth Century, edited by Steven Nadler, and T. M. Rudavsky (Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 2008), v-vii.

[2] Michael Zank, "The Heteronomy of Jewish Philosophy," in The Journal of Jewish Thought and Philosophy, 20.1, 2012, 99-134. It should be noted that Zank's provocative article argues that Jewish philosophy has always exhibited such heteronomy; while he may be correct in toto, it seems indisputable to me that this is true of modern Jewish philosophy.

[3]This roster would include Solomon Maimon, Nachman Krochmal, the Vilna Gaon, Moshe Haim Luzzatto, Samuel David Luzzatto, Elijah Benamozegh, Abraham Joshua Heschel, Rachel Adler, Idit Dobbs-Weinstein, James Kugel, Harry Frankfurt, Mordechai Kaplan, Leo Strauss, and Joseph Soleveitchik.